A Decent Life: Morality for the Rest of Us

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Todd May, A Decent Life: Morality for the Rest of Us, University of Chicago Press, 2019, 212pp., $25.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226609744.

Reviewed by Marcel van Ackeren, Cologne/CIBSS Freiburg


Todd May's book contributes to debates related to the question of how much morality can ask from us, by providing a compelling argument supporting a moderate account of morality, the decent life. Decency is meant to be attractive for those who are not willing or capable of going to their own and morality's limits by living a saintly and altruistic life, but neither want to abandon morality altogether. The book also departs from the style of most contemporary debates in ethics; for it is not only written in a very clear style but also almost completely avoids technical language. Instead, it provides vivid and often personal stories and cases that are not abstractly engineered tools for pumping intuitions. May's book is good philosophy for all us.

In the first chapter, May expounds the problem to which his concept of a decent life is meant to respond, and he also outlines its key concept, "decency", which he then elaborates in the rest of the book. His point of departure is the observation that the majority of human beings do not fully or always comply with morality's demands as they have often been understood -- that is, that most of us do not live a wholly altruistic or saintly life. May explains this by claiming that "traditional moral philosophy asks too much" (p. 11) and that there are two noteworthy aspects of this.

First, by arguing that morality asks too much, he seems to refer to two ideas rather than one, namely, the principle ought-implies-can and the notion of demandingness. On the one hand, he remarks that "theories ask more than most of us are capable of" (p. 10) or that moral theories ask for something that is "impossible for many of us to achieve" (p. 11). On the other, he explains non-compliance by referring to the cost to the moral agent. May does not explain in detail which notion of the principle ought-implies-can he has in mind, but the first explanation seems to be more problematic. It is hard to see how non-compliance explained by the principle ought-implies-can is an argument against a normative theory that accepts the principle. I wonder if May, when stating that most of us are "not capable" of full compliance, really has something like logical or physical impossibility in mind, or if he rather alludes to some moral incapability or a simple lack of motivation. There is a difference between saying that a person cannot save the drowning child because of being in coma, and saying that a person cannot motivate herself to sacrifice a luxurious lifestyle in order to donate more for famine relief. I take it that May is more interested in this second explanation, which concerns demandingness. Some sentences point in that direction, for example, when he says that his theory of decency addresses all of us who do not "sacrifice our deepest personal commitments and projects if these conflict with moral requirements, be they consequentialist, deontological, or virtue ethical" (p. 14).

Second, it is worth highlighting that by arguing that traditional morality asks too much, May does not discriminate between consequentialism, deontology, or virtue ethics. This is surprising and a welcome and rather original departure from the current debate on demandingness, which is still focused on consequentialism. Maximizing, impartial act consequentialism has, in particular, been considered the obvious or only target theory of demandingness objections (see Raz 1993, 1297; Hooker 2009, 148). Only very recently has the debate started to discuss theories other than consequentialism, such as contractualism (Ashford 2003), virtue ethics (Swanton 2009), and deontology, particularly of the Kantian variety (van Ackeren and Sticker 2018). That May also mentions ancient virtue ethics is a further extension of the scope of the debate that should be welcomed. However, we should note that by holding the view that all traditional moral theories ask too much, May is not necessarily committed to the stronger view that these theories do so equally. This claim would require a rather comprehensive and comparative study regarding the demandingness of different types of normative theory. This is not May's aim and, to my knowledge, such a comparative study is still a desideratum. All May needs as a starting point for his argument that we need a new morality of decency is the observation that all major variants of normative theories suffer from a lack of compliance. What makes May's account outstanding is his reaction to this lack of compliance, which comes in two steps.

In the first step, he argues that the lack of compliance with normative moral theories should be seen as a serious problem for these theories. Unlike philosophers such as Goodin (2009), who dig in their heels by arguing that morality demands what it demands and that non-compliance with a theory does not indicate that the theory is bad but only that its addressees are, May considers non-compliance a problem for moral theories. He presents three arguments. The first is (i) that if the goal of aiding others "is to make meaningful lives available to them, then I should have permission to create a meaningful life for myself as well" (p. 18). This resembles what Cullity has called a demandingness objection that is based on an argument from presuppositions (Cullity 2009 and 2003). May then argues (ii) that "if everyone acted in accordance with a strict morality, there would be less access for many of us to live a meaningful life." (p. 18). This echoes Wolf's claim that if one becomes as morally good as possible the moral values will expel all other non-moral values and thereby diminish the meaningfulness or quality of one's life, which requires a well-rounded plurality of different values including non-moral ones (Wolf 1982). He also (iii) takes non-compliance to be a fact that we might not like but should accept as a reality. If non-compliance is widespread, persistent, and something that all variants of normative theories face, then May thinks that we have good reason to start looking for a new moral philosophy, one that provides a moral account and guidance for this majority of the human population.

In the second step, May argues that this new morality for the majority should not be construed as a variant of the traditional theories that ask too much. May thereby rejects more theoretical suggestions, like Scheffler's agent-centered prerogatives, because he believes them to be solutions only on the abstract theoretical level which cannot guide our daily lives.

He admits that the theory he proposes will not be able to solve all moral disagreement and dilemmata (p. 27), but claims that it will offer guidance that does not feel "alien" or like an external demand. In order to achieve this applicability, he, like Epicurus (Letter to Herodot, 35), advises against theoretical solutions that are too complicated to be internalized and applied in "daily engagements" and suggests that we travel light, that is, use lesser and simpler concepts than those in the traditional theories. Accordingly, he does not spend much time explaining his core concept "decency" in a theoretical manner, but on making practical ethics more practical (again).

He plausibly links his approach to an Ethics of Care (p. 59-65). In doing so, he is quite successful in highlighting the difference between his view and that of theories that use concepts like obligation, rights, guilt, and blame. He is cautious enough to admit that thinking about morality in terms of obligation, duty, and so forth can be adequate; but, according to him, the usage of these concepts deprives us of something positive, namely that morality "makes my life, the life of the giver, go better." (p. 49) Overall, his description of the decent life is more clearly and plausibly distinguished from deontology and consequentialism than from virtue ethics. Very often, he stops short of calling decency a virtue, for example, when stressing that it has to be habituated (p. 148). However, his approach resembles many features of ancient eudaimonistic variants of virtue ethics, more specifically those that were considered a way of living. Like the Roman Stoics, he suggests practical exercises in the form of imagination-practices or "internal monologues" that should help us to live decently (p. 64-69, 130-132).

In the first chapter, he remarks that decency is based on the acknowledgement that there are other persons with preferences, plans, and projects. "And that is a fact that I should take into account or, even better, inculcate as a natural part of my own behavior." (p. 3) He later stresses that this recognition does not presuppose impartiality, which, to May, is the "conclusion of traditional moral theory" (p. 31).

The remaining chapters are designed to elaborate the idea of the decent life. Like the Stoic Hierocles (see Stobaeus, Floreligium 4.671), May uses concentric circles to describe the application of his core concept, starting with decency towards persons that are close to us and that we can see face to face (ch. 2), then widening the circle to more distant others (ch. 3) and non-human animals (ch.4.), and finally turning to political issues (ch. 5).

The second chapter is about "decency towards those with whom we broadly share a space and time" (p. 37). May explains that this is deliberately broad as it should include those with whom we communicate via Skype, email, or letters because all these modes of communication bring other persons into our space and time (p. 38). May stresses the importance of experiencing (rather than only knowing) that we have another real person in front of us and stresses that looking at someone's face is the most intuitive and effective way to recognize the life of other persons. He refers to a phenomenon that is "mundane enough that it might elude reflection" (p. 40), namely that we avoid looking into someone else's face when we shout at them or when we refuse to give money to a homeless person who is begging. May concludes that looking at faces "can move us to treat others in more humane ways than we might otherwise be tempted to." (p. 43)

According to May, decency can be "contagious", because it is likely to be passed on from one person to another. First, a beneficiary is more likely to act decently herself than a person who has not been a beneficiary. Second, those who witness an act of decency are more likely to follow it as a paradigm than those who do not know that decency is something more or less common. May points to a variation of the Milgram experiment, in which Milgram found that persons are more likely to refuse the order to administer a shock to a learner when they witnessed that someone else already refused to do so (p. 46). Throughout the entire book, May shows awareness of problems and limits concerning his account. For example, he is aware that there is no guarantee that decency will be contagious in the sense specified and that it is hard to draw a line between decency and altruism.

The third chapter starts with the argument that it would be indecent to ignore all persons that we never come face to face with -- which is the vast majority of human beings. May distinguishes two groups of distant persons. The first group consists of those who are dead and those are excluded. His account of decency is more concerned with the second group of persons, namely, those distant in space and those distant in time because they do not yet exist. This division of subgroups allows him to capture actions, for example, related to climate change, that effect currently living and future persons (p. 71-4). But he also acknowledges differences between these two subgroups and treats them in succession. May distinguishes two forms of decency towards those distant in space: benevolence (or charity) is the extended form of decency, because it is about what we can actually do for those distant individuals. The second form of decency towards distant persons is "political involvement which would be an intervention not for the sake of a particular individual but instead to affect the social, political, or economic structure within which a number of individuals live." (p. 75) This is the topic of the fifth chapter, which I will discuss below. May claims that there is no way to generally decide whether focusing on currently living or future persons is better (p. 89-90).

As to benevolence, May argues against the view that Kagan has argued for in The Limits of Morality, namely, that we have to treat those distant in space with strict impartiality because morality is essentially strictly impartial. May first sides with Wolf by admitting that morality is impartial but claiming that it is not overriding, so that there are cases in which it is rational not to act morally. May then provides another rather surprising argument. He supposes that his view is wrong and "that Singer and Kagan are correct" (p. 79) in assuming morality is impartial and overriding. Even then, he concludes, there is no need to live an extreme altruistic and saintly life. He concludes that even if Singer and Kagan were right, we need not accept all demands to aid distant needy persons but only some of them (p. 77-79). I think this conclusion needs further argumentation. If May believes that there are reasons speaking against full compliance with all moral demands at all costs, and therefore believes that there are good reasons for not living a saintly life and that for some of us these reasons can be decisive, then he seems to imply that moral reasons are not always overriding. I think it is possible to read his book as suggesting that morality might be impartial, but that those who do not fully comply with it are not irrational, meaning that the moral reasons of the traditional moral theories are not overriding.

May distinguishes his own view from maximizing and very demanding representations of morality by suggesting that we focus, not on all needs of all distant persons, as this would require extensive knowledge, but only on one or two areas in which distant people live. This would be enough to spark benevolence and allow us to show some decency instead of becoming altruists. May's section on decency towards distant people in time contains a very fine introduction to problems related to climate ethics and especially the non-identity-problem, which is not always explained in such an accessible way (p. 95-98).

The fourth chapter again widens the circle by discussing decency towards non-human animals. May starts by dismissing speciesism and explaining moral individualism. He generally sides with Singer on this and argues that it is convincing that the moral capacities of an individual (human or non-human) give us the decisive clues for our moral behavior. He then discusses objections against moral individualism, but concludes that its "core idea that other animals have lives to live and they should not be made to suffer in those lives" (p. 124) is plausible and should be followed. Again, he argues that full compliance with moral individualism is problematic as it would require great sacrifice. "Rather than taking it as an unrealizable ideal or a framework that cannot match what it frames, we can go another direction, taking the central insight from moral individualism and asking how best to integrate it into our daily lives." (p. 129) I do not wish to object to this argument or to the practical suggestions that May takes to follow from it. I only wonder if, at the beginning, he overemphasized that he will abandon traditional and abstract moral theories and come up with something completely different. At least here, his strategy seems to retain key elements from certain theories and to suggest practical application without demanding full compliance.

The fifth chapter, as announced, discusses decency as "political engagement" concerning the "normative construction of shared space" (p. 144), that is, the political, social, and economic structure in which we act: "We cannot ask how to act decently without taking the structure of our situation into account." (p. 138)

Before commenting on his actual and, again, mostly practical suggestions, I would like to point out that the existence of such a chapter in a book on moderate versions of morality is noteworthy. The debate on demandingness objections, at least in the meta-ethical literature, very often sidesteps social and political aspects, though there is now a recent interest in collective overdemandingness. To be sure, Scheffler (1992, ch. 8) pointed out that the congruence of morality and well-being is also a matter of social and political structures. Scheffler's arguments, which May surely would call very abstract, hinted at some important relations: the demandingness of a morally required act, and thus the level of compliance, highly depend on social or political factors. In circumstances like war or economic crisis, or in unjust societies, there is much more good to be done because of an increased number of victims and needy persons. And the social, legal, and political circumstances in unjust societies can make it costlier for an agent to perform even the most basic acts of decency, for example, when those who help refugees by not letting them drown, starve, or freeze are put on trial (as it is the case in Hungary or Italy). How much we are willing to sacrifice in order to comply with morality, and whether we consider this to be a sacrifice in the first place, is also as matter of our education, social, and political structures. In sum, May's chapter contributes to the rather unexplored relation of non-compliance with morality and political or social structures. One important lesson to be learned from his discussion of decency is that the question which actions with regard to political matters would be decent and how demanding these are for the agent are highly context-relative matters. In other words, his chapter points to some limitations of universal talk in practical ethics. One the other side, it is clear that what he says about the state of affairs in the USA also holds true for other societies and political systems. He clearly takes sides by claiming that the new lack of political civility was mainly caused by more right-wing political agents, and he plausibly points to the corrosive effect that Donald Trump and his supporters have. But a lack of political civility is not exclusive to the USA, as politicians like Viktor Orbán, Rodrigo Duterte, Matteo Salvini, Jair Bolsonaro, or Björn Höcke show us on a daily basis.

May explains that decency, when it comes to dealing with political opponents, concerns a range of very important topics and practices ranging from debating with family or friends to questions concerning free speech at universities, press-coverage, and non-violence in political struggles. He here draws from his extensive experience as a political campaigner, which might be the reason why I found the stories and examples in this chapter to be especially authentic and forceful. And though climate change and the well-being of non-human animals certainly are extremely urgent and very important matters, my impression is that this chapter makes the book especially timely.

At the beginning, I claimed that May's book is good philosophy for all of us. In order to conclude my review, I should explain this unashamed and bold appraisal. In the first paragraph of his first book, Morality, Bernard Williams famously mocked many writers because they successfully avoided misleading readers about matters of importance, "either by making it impossible to take them seriously, or by refusing to write about anything of importance, or both" (Williams 1972, p. 9). I have to confess that when I learned that May worked on continental philosophy I feared that he might be one of those writers whose sentences are not even wrong. I am glad that he proved this expectation to be a prejudice. In the concluding chapter, May explains and defends his style and especially the use of narration. His style is deceptive, at least insofar as he provides many arguments that are interesting also from the viewpoint of technical literature. My hope is that his book will also have an impact on these more theoretical debates, even though it is not his primary interest to contribute to them. The quality of May's style and the vividness of the stories and cases is a sword that cuts both ways across the continental-analytical divide in philosophy. My review could not do justice to the wealth of stories in this book; instead, I have focused on some more theoretical claims and underlying arguments. I mention this because a lack of clarity and arguments is usually not the problem in the analytical tradition; rather, the literature, even in practical ethics, can be very arid, abstract, and technical, thereby narrowing down the readership. I am not complaining about this style either, but books like May's should not be seen as a coffee-table-version of the 'real' philosophical literature (though, I am afraid, many hiring committees might regard it as such). My hunch is that it would be good for analytical, especially practical, ethics if more of its proponents would also write books like May's, or at least ask themselves if they were capable of presenting their abstract findings in such a way.


This work was supported by the German Research Foundation (DFG) under Germany's Excellence Strategy (CIBSS -- EXC-2189 -- Project ID 390939984).


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