A Defense of Abortion

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Boonin, David, A Defense of Abortion, Cambridge University Press, 2003, 350pp, $23.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521520355. Reviewed by: Win-chiat Lee, Wake Forest University

Reviewed by Win-chiat Lee , Wake Forest University


In this book Boonin is primarily interested in establishing a negative case for the moral permissibility of abortion by showing that the arguments made against it by its critics all fail. But Boonin does not have his eye set on doing that alone. In fact, he is also interested in showing that these arguments can be defeated on grounds that the critics of abortion accept. To this end, Boonin goes over a very large number of such arguments, organized around three themes, and shows how they all fail.

This is a very impressive book. I think Boonin has largely succeeded in what he sets out to do. The outcome is a very exhaustive treatment of the subject of the moral permissibility of abortion, which also makes it a very exhausting and demanding read. It is hard to imagine that Boonin has left any deserving stone unturned on the subject. Boonin's treatment of the arguments of the critics of abortion is thorough, judicious, and careful. His refutation is typically decisive and often very insightful. If there is any fault in his treatment of the critics' arguments, it is probably that he has bent over backwards to be charitable in some cases. Boonin's book is definitely an important contribution to the philosophical debate on abortion.

In the following, I will attempt to give an account of the overall structure of the book and comment on some the philosophical issues involved in the book as a whole. I hope my critical remarks do not distract too much from the overall very favorable impression I intend to convey about the book. I will also make very little effort, except in two or three cases, to summarize or discuss the particular arguments Boonin considers in the book and his reasons for rejecting them. That has proved to be an impossible task, given the sheer number of arguments Boonin discusses in each chapter. In this way, this review does not do justice to the book because these particular arguments are where the real action of the book takes place. Boonin's resourcefulness, originality, clear-headedness and insightfulness comes through most clearly in the detail of his treatment of each of the arguments he considers.

In this book, Boonin is only concerned about the narrower question of whether abortion is morally permissible. But what exactly does it mean to say that abortion is morally permissible? Does it mean that abortion is not wrong morally speaking, as it typically would? It is not clear that that is what Boonin has in mind. He distinguishes between the moral impermissibility of an act or a practice from its moral criticizability, the former being “qualitatively stronger” than the latter (4-5). According to him, from the claim that an act is morally permissible, it does not follow that one ought to do it or that one is not morally criticizable for doing it (7). But does this mean there may still be other moral reasons against doing it that are conclusive? If it does, it seems that one may still be wrong in doing what is morally permissible. If that is the case, one wonders what exactly the claim that abortion is morally permissible amounts to. The following sentence offers no help: “To say that an action is permissible is not to say that there are no moral reasons against doing the action, but only that it is a candidate from which one is morally permitted to choose” (7-8, italics are mine).

The most helpful account of moral permissibility Boonin offers is the following: “To say that an action of mine is morally permissible is to say that no one has a valid claim against my doing it, that doing it violates nobody's moral rights” (5). Thus, to say that abortion is morally permissible is to say that no one's moral right is violated by abortion. On this analysis, moral impermissibility is simply a very specific kind of wrong that involves the violation of someone's moral rights. (If this is what moral impermissibility is, one wonders how there can be a category of non-rights-based arguments for the moral impermissibility of abortion to discuss in the closing chapter of the book.) In that case, Boonin owes us an account of why moral impermissibility, as a specific kind of wrong involving the violation of someone's moral rights, is always, as he puts it, “qualitatively stronger” than other kinds of wrong. That is, Boonin owes us an account as to why the duties that are neither based on or correlatives of other people's rights can never rise to the same level of importance or seriousness as those that are.

Given Boonin's analysis of moral permissibility, it is clear why most of the book is devoted to the discussion of whether abortion violates anyone's rights. That discussion comes in two stages. First, there is the discussion of the all-too-familiar question, whether the fetus has the right to life (Chs. 2 and 3). Then the discussion proceeds to consider the question, whether such a right, if it exists, is violated by an abortion (Ch.4). If Boonin can establish, albeit negatively through the refutation of the opponents' arguments, either 1) the fetus does not have the right to life, at least through a good part of the pregnancy, or 2) an abortion does not violate the aborted fetus's right to life even if it has such a right, then he has made the case for the moral permissibility of abortion. Boonin attempts to establish both claims. But either one will suffice as a case against the rights-based critics of abortion.

In Chs. 2 and 3, Boonin goes over a number of arguments that attempt to establish that the fetus has the right to life and shows how they all fail. These arguments all start with the assumption that you and I have the right to life and then attempt to show that you and I are indeed related to the fetus in such way that it will be morally inconsistent for us not to treat the fetus as also having the right to life. Ch. 2 examines nine arguments that try to show that the fetus has the right to life at conception. The upshot of Boonin's discussion is this. It can't be the case that it is by virtue of being members of the human species alone that you and I have the right to life. Therefore, it must be some other properties that you and I share that explain why we have the right to life. Whatever other properties you and I actually share with the fetus either cannot explain why you and I have the right to life or cannot rule out sperms and eggs as also having the right to life. Therefore, if the fetus has the right to life at conception, then it must be due to the fact that it will come to possess later on the relevant properties you and I already possess.

The argument Boonin considers to be the strongest in this regard is Don Marquis's future-like-ours argument. But in Boonin's view, this argument ultimately fails to show that the fetus has the right to life at conception. Even though there is no denying that a fetus at conception has a future-like-ours, another necessary ingredient is missing, namely, that the fetus values such a future. Boonin thinks we cannot attribute any desire in any sense to a being unless it has some actual desires. The earliest we can attribute any actual desire to the fetus is by the 25th week of gestation. That is when the fetus starts having organized cortical brain activity, according to Boonin's empirical argument— well after more than 99% of the abortions in the United States has been performed. This organized cortical brain activity criterion is what Boonin endorses in Ch. 3 after he considers and rejects several other postconception criteria—criteria such as implantation, fetal movement, and initial brain activity—as candidates for the criterion for the right to life.

In Ch. 4, which takes up almost half of the book, Boonin enters the second stage of his discussion, which is to show that abortion does not violate a fetus's right to life even if it has such a right. Here Boonin invokes Judith Jarvis Thomson's famous argument in defense of abortion that appeals to an imaginary situation as an analogy. In this imaginary situation, a person wakes up one morning and finds herself, without her consent, connected intravenously to a famous violinist. The violinist, as the story goes, will need this arrangement for nine months in order to live. Like the person who does not violate the violinist's right to life by disconnecting herself from the violinist, a mother who aborts a fetus also does not violate the fetus's right to life. Boonin labels this argument “the good Samaritan argument” to highlight the idea that one (the fetus) does not have the right to assistance from someone else (the mother) if the cost for that person to provide such assistance (the burden of carrying the pregnancy to term) is great.

Not surprisingly, many objections to the good Samaritan argument are devoted to identifying some moral disanalogy between the case of the violinist and abortion. There are two kinds of disanalogy proposed. The first kind focuses on the following difference: the person who finds herself connected to the violinist has not done anything voluntarily to bring about that situation whereas the mother, in non-rape cases, voluntarily participates in a sexual intercourse that results in the pregnancy. The second kind focuses on the difference between the nature of the act of disconnecting from the violinist and the nature of the act of aborting the fetus (letting die vs. killing and intending vs. foreseeing death, for example). Presumably this second kind of disanalogy does not distinguish between rape cases and non-rape cases. Boonin discusses both kinds of disanalogy.

One objection, among the sixteen that Boonin considers, stands out, in my view, as the most promising. This is the one Boonin calls, “the responsibility objection.” It appeals to a disanalogy of the first kind. According to this objection, the mother is responsible for the existence of the fetus and its being in a state of need if the pregnancy is the result of a voluntary sexual intercourse, whereas the person attached to the violinist is responsible for neither his existence nor his being in a state of need. Therefore, from the fact that the violinist does not have his right violated if he gets disconnected, it does not follow that the fetus does not have its right violated if it gets aborted. Boonin's reply is that one needs to distinguish between being responsible for another person's existence and being responsible for her state, given that she already exists (169). The mother is at best responsible for the existence of the fetus, but not responsible for the fact that the fetus cannot survive outside her womb, given that it now exists. The thought here is that the mother does not have the option of bringing into existence a fetus without its being in a condition of having certain needs which only she can satisfy. Her situation is therefore different from that of a person who, through a voluntary act, creates a dependency of another existing person on her.

One would think that it makes a difference to the mother's obligation towards the fetus whether she has engaged in the sexual intercourse voluntarily without the use of contraception while foreseeing the possibility (or even the likelihood) of getting pregnant in doing so. Boonin is unmoved by such consideration. He writes, “If the good samaritan argument is successful in rape cases, then it is successful in nonrape cases as well, including cases of voluntary intercourse in which contraception is not used” (188). This sounds right to me if we concentrate on the right of the fetus to life or its right to aid. Why should it matter to the fetus's rights how it comes into existence? Why should a fetus that is conceived in a rape have fewer rights than a fetus whose parents engage in the intercourse voluntarily but do not care to use contraception? This indicates to me that those who want to argue for the disanalogy between the violinist case and abortion in non-rape cases cannot rely on a rights-based approach. They had better look elsewhere for the source of the special obligation of the mother (and perhaps even the father) towards the fetus in non-rape cases to make a case for the moral impermissibility of abortion in such cases. Nor can we simply assume that such a non-rights-based approach will be unsuccessful without begging the question (that the kind of moral reason against doing something that does not involve the violation of rights can never be conclusive).

Boonin seems to me to have come quite close to doing just that in his rejection of the pro-life feminist argument later in the book. This is the kind of argument that is based on an ethics of care inspired by Carol Gilligan's famous book, In a Different Voice. From that kind of ethics, Boonin writes, “It follows that a woman who has an abortion acts uncaringly, and that a feminist is entitled to criticize her morally on these grounds. But it does not follow that a feminist should conclude that a woman who has an abortion does something that is morally impermissible. Many acts that are criticizable as uncaring are nonetheless morally permissible.” (303) Perhaps more needs to be said here about why the moral reasons against abortion that stem from the value of caring can never be conclusive. Regardless, the pro-life feminist's appeal to the value of caring to make an argument against abortion is problematic on other grounds. For one, it is not clear that abortion is never a caring response to an unwanted pregnancy.

The discussion of the pro-life feminist argument is part of the final chapter of Boonin's book that deals with non-rights-based arguments for the moral impermissibility of abortion. This is also the shortest among the chapters that discuss the specific arguments against abortion. This is simply a reflection of how fixated on rights the debate on the morality of abortion has been – a holdover perhaps from the legal debate that is rightly focused on rights.

One problem I have with the book as a whole is its preoccupation with showing that the arguments of the critics of abortion can be defeated on their own grounds. It is understandable that given the contentious nature of the subject, Boonin's defense of abortion would employ such a strategy in order to make a more effective contribution to the debate. But this also makes Boonin's defense of abortion only as good as those premises that the critics can or do already accept. If our interest is not only in engaging the critics of abortion, but also in knowing the truth of the matter, then these premises themselves will also need to be examined. As in the Socratic practice of elenchus, Boonin's refutation of the arguments of the critics of abortion on grounds they accept does not by itself establish knowledge about the matter.