A Defense of Hume on Miracles, Princeton

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Fogelin, Robert J., A Defense of Hume on Miracles, Princeton, 2003, 112pp, $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 0691114307.

Reviewed by Terence Penelhum, University of Calgary


This little book in the Princeton Monographs series is a predictably vigorous and original treatment of an essay that has stimulated more responses than anything else Hume wrote. Most of these responses have been ineffective and of low quality, and even those that make useful philosophical points often embody misunderstandings of what Hume says. Fogelin makes clear why this is, as well as putting us straight about the actual nature of Hume’s argument. I agree with the main thrust of his account, and with his responses to those critics of Hume whom he discusses, so the reservations I express will be minor.

Fogelin not only sees that the reader has to put aside the essay’s tone in order to see what the structure of its argument is, but also sees that any account of that argument has to assign a clear role to each of its two parts. Both parts are devoted to one theme: how the “wise man” should respond to testimony to the miraculous. On many readings, Part II becomes a pointless exercise. In it Hume points out defects in the quality of the actual miracle testimony available to us; but on these readings, in Part I Hume has already dismissed the possibility of miracles on a priori grounds. If this were so, it would not matter whether actual testimony was good or bad; either way, Hume would be continuing to flog a horse he had already killed. I think Fogelin’s analysis of the first part is the right one, and shows that the combined argument is harder to answer than its critics usually suppose.

The core of the first part, as Fogelin describes it, is this: the fact that a miracle would be a violation of a law of nature implies that it would run counter to all our previous experience of phenomena of its type. This provides us with what Hume calls “a direct and full proof” against any testimony that it has occurred. Only a superior proof on the other side, deriving from the quality of that testimony, could override this. The purpose of the second part is to show that the testimony we actually have has never come close to meeting the standards that are necessary to provide such a competing proof. Hence the negative conclusion of the essay that “no human testimony can have such force as to prove a miracle, and make it a just foundation for any … system of religion.”

To evaluate this argument one has to understand the suggestion that there could be competing proofs. Fogelin points out the provenance of this suggestion in Hume’s earlier discussions of probability. In most contexts the word “proof” is used as a success-term whose meaning is tied to truth, so that it appears absurd to suggest that there could be two opposing proofs. But as Hume uses the term, it is not absurd to suggest that there could be two such arguments, of which one leads to a false conclusion. This implies that Hume is not quite accurate when he tells us that his use is one that conforms to common speech; but however this may be, he distinguishes reasonably clearly between proofs and probabilities, taking the former to be arguments from experience that leave no room for doubt. As Hume describes the possibilities in the first part, it is in theory possible to have a situation in which an event is reported that would be a violation of a natural law, yet is reported by many competent and disinterested witnesses whose combined testimony it would be unreasonable to doubt. In such a case we would have a proof against it, because it would be counter to uniform past experience, but also a proof in its favour, because of the impeccable testimony. That he manifestly does not think this ever happens, and makes it clear by his tone from the outset that he feels this way, does not affect the fact that this is what Part I says. This leaves the second part with a clear purpose: that of telling us what the quality of the actual testimony to miracles has been. Hume thinks it has never approached the quality it would need in order to counterbalance the negative proof provided by the uniform experience supporting the law that the supposed miracle would violate. Whether Hume is fair in the second part or not, what he says there is essential for his case.

All of this is fully compatible with historical arguments suggesting that the thesis of the first part was originally developed by Hume to answer Arnauld’s claims about miracle testimony, and arguments showing that the details in the second part would not have been new or startling to English readers familiar with earlier debates between orthodox Christians and deists. These facts show what sort of topicality Hume thought his arguments would have, but they do not show that his essay does not have the structure Fogelin says it has.

In addition to making a convincing case for his reading, Fogelin has interesting things to say about a number of topics. He places the essay in the general context of Hume’s theory of knowledge, and has a helpful appendix about Hume’s disingenuous use of an argument of John Tillotson. He also answers two of the most recent critics of Hume. Armoured as he is by a better understanding of the text than theirs, he has no difficulty refuting them, but although he has every right to his victories, I would myself have been more interested to see what he had to say about some stronger philosophical targets, such as Ninian Smart, Richard Swinburne, J. Houston--or even William Paley. The book contains a reprinting of Hume’s essay itself, which facilitates an estimate of Fogelin’s contentions about it. The only problem with it is that it encourages the lamentable tendency for readers to ignore the fact that it is followed in the original by the section “Of a Particular Providence and of a Future State”, which is far too little read and is philosophically more important. It is also relevant in another way, since it may contain Hume’s answer to critics like Paley who said that the case for miracles is strengthened by prior demonstrations of the existence of God, which Hume has disregarded.

But these are cavils. The book is splendid, sophisticated historically and philosophically, and fun to read.

I turn now to the main problem I have with Fogelin’s reading of Part I. While I have no doubt that he is correct to deny that Hume thinks this part contains a demonstration that miracles cannot occur, or that the testimony in their favour need never be attended to, I do not think that Hume’s position there is quite as theoretically accommodating as Fogelin thinks it is. Suppose we are in a situation where there is “proof against proof” in the way Hume contemplates: impeccable testimony to an event that would be a violation of natural law. This is the best situation a story could be in if the event it tells of is a miracle by Hume’s definition. I do not see that his argument allows for even the theoretical possibility of resolution in favour of the testimony. It does not require that the testimony be rejected, indeed; but it seems to me that the most it can allow is suspension of judgment, or what Hume calls “counterpoise” or equilibrium. Hume does write of the falsehood of the witness’s testimony being “more miraculous, than the event which he relates”. But this has to be a purely rhetorical supposition, since his definition of miracle does not admit of degrees of miraculousness: either an event would constitute a violation of law or it would not. And I do not think that the example of the eight days of darkness helps here. Hume offers it in language that fudges its description. He concedes only that there may be “violations of the usual course of nature” (my emphasis), and says that the “decay, dissolution and corruption of nature” is something that many analogies render probable, so that it would only be an apparent miracle when all the chips were down. Now conceding the wisdom of suspended judgment is much more positive than the a priori denial that Hume is usually accused of recommending, but it is not tantamount to allowing a positive verdict, even in theory. It seems to me that it allows only three outcomes when the equilibrium ends: the discovery of fatal flaws in the testimony, the adjustment of our prior understanding of the law to accommodate the reported event, or the discovery of some unrecognized features of the event that permit us to subsume it under the law as previously understood. I cannot see that it lets us decide that there has been a miracle after all. All three of the outcomes that it does allow are outcomes that Hume’s critics think his argument precludes, and I agree it is of great importance to see that it does not preclude them. (For example, recognising that it does not preclude them refutes those who think that Hume’s argument saves us from the trouble of examining testimonial evidence for parapsychological phenomena.) But I still do not see that Hume allows us to accept there have been “miracles”. It merely allows us to suspend judgment about them – a suspense that can only be resolved in the negative direction.

The defect here, if I am right, is in Hume rather than Fogelin. This is the best defence of Hume on miracles that there is, and is indispensable for anyone who wants to take the measure of his argument.