A Defense of Simulated Experience: New Noble Lies

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Mark Silcox, A Defense of Simulated Experience: New Noble Lies, Routledge, 2019, 155pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780367077532.

Reviewed by Marcus Arvan, University of Tampa


Mark Silcox's short but wide-ranging book defends a novel account of the nature and value of simulated experience. The first half (Chapters 1 and 2) aims to define simulated experience and provide 'a partial survey of some of the most interesting and controversial varieties' (40). A two-page Interlude then contends that because no 'absolutely uncontroversial' descriptive definition exists, simulated experiences are better understood as normative kinds united by 'a very distinctive normative character' (4). The second half (Chapters 3 and 4) aims to specify that normative character and how it should inform political theory and practice. Chapter 3 argues that

The most fundamental, defining feature shared by all simulated experiences . . . is that political actors have a special -- and, in a certain rather unusual sense to be specified . . . overriding-type of obligation to bring about . . . psychological states, both for themselves and for their fellow citizens': specifically, states of 'political obligatoriness. (82)

In Chapter 4 Silcox then argues that this normative character justifies a 'quasi-respectful paternalism' (135) where deceptive social policies -- not freely chosen by citizens (130) -- are utilized to 'interfere . . . to protect us from our own everyday irrationality' while being 'designed to cause the subjects of such policies to experience simulacra of respect' (135). Although I found his book an interesting read, I was unpersuaded by his central descriptive and normative claims.

Chapter 1 addresses the question, 'Under what circumstances does an experience of type X count as a simulation of some other experience of Type Y?' (21). Silcox first notes that while some theorists argue for individuating experience-types internally (viz., phenomenology), externalists argue that experience-types can only be individuated relative to the surrounding environment (21-2). This is important because he then asserts, 'It seems to me that any philosophically adequate characterization of simulated human experiences will have to occupy a rather singular stretch of middle ground between internalist and externalist approaches." (22) Silcox's rationale for this is that 'The verb to simulate shares a common Latin root . . . with the adjective similar' (23), but 'Whether or not the relation of similarity itself obtains between two or more things is almost certainly regarded as a paradigmatically subjective phenomenon' (23). His argument, in other words, seems to be that simulated experiences tend to have external content but internal similarity-conditions. However, his central premise here -- that similarity is paradigmatically subjective -- seems false. The similarities between these two trees outside of my window do not seem subjective: the two trees seem objectively similar, as his own later account of 'actual similarity' in functionalist terms holds (29).

In any case, Silcox's hypothesis that simulated experiences occupy a middle ground between internalism and externalism generates problems for his descriptive definition of simulated experiences, which is:


A person P is undergoing an experience a of type E that is a simulation of an experience b of type E'


  1. P's experiential state a is of type E, and

  2. Experiences of type E' are psychologically accessible to P,

  3. P's experiential state a shares n (>0) actual similarities with some experience b of type E'. (24)

Consider [Σ]'s second condition, which holds that for experience a to simulate E' to person P, experience-type E' must be 'psychologically accessible' to P. When does an experience-type satisfy this condition? One possibility is internalist -- identifying psychological accessibility with subjective conceivability. Silcox raises this possibility, writing 'there is obviously at least a sense in which, as soon as one asks, "Can I conceive of x?" the answer must always be "yes"' (25). However, he rejects this as over-inclusive, holding instead that the 'The notion of accessibility that I shall be relying on . . . [is] that of imagination rather than conception' (25), where this appears to involve reference to external objects. This is implied by Silcox's discussion of Putnam's externalist response to skeptical scenarios. Following Putnam, he suggests that if a person lived her entire life as a brain in a vat, it would be prima facie impossible for her to imagine the skeptical hypothesis that she is a brain in a vat since she has never been in 'causal relationships with actual brains', only 'illusory brains'. (36)

Setting aside whether Putnam's anti-skeptical argument is sound, is 'psychological accessibility' plausibly a necessary condition for simulated experience on either an internalist or externalist reading? Consider first the externalist reading that, to be psychologically accessible, a person must be able to imagine the original experience his simulated experience is simulating, where imagining the former involves causal reference to it. On this reading, in the film The Matrix, the character Neo was not having simulated experiences inside the Matrix until he was freed and experiences the 'real world' for the first time -- since it is only once he is freed that he has any causal contact with experiences of the real world. This seems wrong. Neo's experiences in the Matrix were always simulating experiences of the real world. After all, the Matrix was designed by its machine overlords to do just that: to give people simulated experiences. Neo just did not have psychological access to this fact. Thus, psychological accessibility does not appear to be a necessary condition for simulated experience on an externalist reading. What about on an internalist reading? This seems like it cannot be a necessary condition for simulated experiences either. For consider someone with impoverished capacities for conceiving things -- someone who, let us imagine, cannot conceive of anything beyond their immediate experience. Suppose such a person may not be able to conceive of what a real war is like. Nevertheless, if that person plays a war simulation, there is a clear sense in which her experiences are simulated experiences of war. She just, again, does not have psychological access to that fact. This suggests, contra Silcox, that psychological accessibility may not be a necessary condition for simulated experiences.

Now consider [Σ]'s third condition, which holds that a simulates E' only if a 'shares n (>0) actual similarities with some experience b of type E'. This seems implausibly inclusive. For consider my experience of phenomenal redness and the experience-type of me thinking about my house. Phenomenal redness is an experience a of type-E that I am having (satisfying Silcox's first condition). The phenomenal experience-type of me thinking of my house is accessible to me (satisfying condition ii). Finally, phenomenal redness clearly has n>0 similarities to me thinking of my house (satisfying condition iii), as they are both experiences that I have had today regarding things in my environment. Consequently, on [Σ], my phenomenal experience of redness simulates me thinking of my house. But that seems hard to fathom.

These issues raise problems for Silcox's claim that simulated experiences form a normative kind. In order to know what type of value simulated experiences have, it seems like we first need an adequate descriptive definition to identify them. Because Silcox's definition seems extensionally over- and under-inclusive, it is an open question whether the things he identifies as simulated experiences are actually members of that kind. This raises a deeper concern, which is that Silcox attempts to define simulated experiences and examine their value without a clear definition of what it is to simulate simpliciter. On standard dictionary definitions, to simulate something is to imitate it. Silcox seems to presuppose this definition when, in Chapter 2, he classifies a wide variety of things -- ranging from theater acting, to thought-experiments, to make-believe -- as simulated experiences. However, imitation plausibly involves two things: (A) objective functional similarities between the simulator and the simulated (29), but also (B) a sense in which the thing doing the imitating is modeled on what it imitates. On pp. 31-2, Silcox briefly discusses a definition of simulation by Justin C. Fisher that implicitly includes both of these conditions. However, although Silcox recognizes that '[Fisher's] definition is quite different in form and content' (31) from Silcox's [Σ], Silcox only writes that 'there do not seem to be any particularly strong conceptual or lexicographical considerations that are likely to settle the issue of whether my own definition of simulated experience in [Σ] is "better" or "worse"' (32). As my above concerns regarding [Σ] indicate, I think Fisher's definition is probably more accurate than Silcox's, and that these matters need to be settled before we can judge whether all of the things that Silcox claims to be simulated experiences really are simulated experiences, and if so, what type of value they have as a kind. I do not think the following stipulation is sufficient: 'Instead of pursuing [such definitional matters] any further, I shall merely stipulate that for the rest of this book, I use the verb "to simulate" in a more restrictive sense' than other theorists do (37).

Chapter 2 examines a catalog of presumptively simulated experiences, ranging from art (42-3), to make-believe (43-4), to games (44-9), to theatrical acting (49-57), to Dissociative Identity Disorder (49-67), to simulated realities (67-76, with Jon Cogburn). Here, Silcox engages in interesting meditations on the ways that simulated experiences may have intrinsic and instrumental value. One intriguing claim is that some types of self-deceit -- such as convincing oneself that one is pursuing a simulated experience (such as playing Dungeons and Dragons) for its own sake -- can be a highly effective means for achieving things a person values, such as 'preparation for the struggles of "real life"', though one may of course wonder how well simulated experiences accomplish this (47). On the other hand, Silcox's response to skepticism about the value of theatrical acting seemed to me to elide the central issues. He writes: 'Consider first the weird Platonic assumption that when a person tries to imitate the cries of a bird or the sounds made by a trumpet, the result will always be . . . performed badly.' (56) Silcox suggests this is implausible because it seems to presuppose 'that any actor must of necessity be a kind of dilettante' (Ibid.). However, Socrates' argument in Book X of The Republic is that imitative arts are bad as a kind in a very specific sense: that of leading people away from the Forms, particularly the Form of Justice (by appealing to base emotions and desires). Augustine's concerns are similar: that theater has 'a tendency to reinforce our natural carelessness' (51). Silcox does not address these arguments in their own terms, which I think is no small thing -- as I think similar concerns can be raised about his later thesis, 'that, whenever new means become available to simulate human experiences where there were none before, there is always a sense in which such innovations have positive value to the polis' (11).

Chapter 3 begins: 'My overarching aim in this chapter it to defend the claim that . . . all normative political philosophy is utopian', and that, 'From this, it may be concluded that simulated experience itself deserves to be regarded as a fundamental type of human good, insofar as no form of political good is conceivable without reference to it' (85). In brief, Silcox's basic idea is that:

it is only by allowing oneself as much space as possible to think about the possible benefits and the potential harms that may be caused by the simulation of an extremely broad variety of human experiences that one may hope to develop an adequately synoptic view of the human good . . . (Ibid.)

However, is all political philosophy utopian? Silcox clarifies that he means that all political philosophy falls into two categories: political utopianism, a 'genre of works that attempt to show how certain public institutions might benefit human beings who resemble our present, flawed selves', and theological utopianism, which '"waits for the complete moral regeneration of the human race".' (86) Silcox writes:

It seems to me that a political philosophy deserves to be classified as utopian precisely to the extent that its adherents would be prepared to endorse arguments of the following form:

The Utopian's Master Argument

Institution P would be favored by the inhabitants of an optimal society.

∴ Political actors have an obligation to bring about P. (88)

However, if this is what makes political philosophy utopian, then not all political philosophy is utopian -- as an increasing number of 'nonideal' theorists (including Amartya Sen, Gerald Gaus, Ryan Muldoon, and myself) reject arguments of the above form, holding that they are perniciously utopian.

This is important because Silcox's argument across Chapters 3 and 4 -- 'that the fundamental value of simulated experience consists in the way that it can serve both as a goal of, and substitute for, utopian political action' (117) -- may itself be perniciously utopian. For example, he suggests that simulated experiences ranging from kibbutzism to socialist communes to Second Life and World of Warcraft are politically valuable because of 'the contribution that they make to achieving the goals of conventional political utopianism without the performance of ethically objectionable political actions in the "real" world' (110). Yet, consider how, 'In the world of Second Life . . . every citizen can fly and nobody starves to death, but there is also prostitution, theft, betrayal, ultranationalism and a great deal of deliberate unkindness' (111). Similarly, consider the example Silcox opens the book with: 'the US Army's . . . personal computer application called America's Army', a free game designed to simulate 'what it might be like to proceed all the way from boot camp to the front lines of modern military combat' (1). Seeing these and other simulated experiences 'as a goal of . . . and substitute for . . . utopian political action' arguably commits the error inherent in utopian thinking in general: the error of thinking that simulating costs and benefits -- in the imagination, in a thought-experiment, or online -- can ever provide a morally adequate analysis of the real costs that social or political organizations should impose upon actual people.

Finally, Chapter 4 explores 'quasi-respectful paternalism' (135), the use of deceptive public policy measures 'to protect us from our own everyday irrationality' (134). Although Silcox rejects similar proposals by others as 'moralistic wishful thinking' (131), he suggests that quasi-respectful paternalism would give its 'subjects . . . simulacra of respect' (134). Specifically, he suggests that because pre-political private property is an irrational myth (120-5), social policies might be designed to '[compensate] taxpayers' (127) who 'feel their prepolitical property rights have been violated' (139) with simulated experiences of 'status conferral and recognition' (135). This, he suggests, would in turn constitute a 'public simulation of respect for the personal autonomy of agents whose deliberations are covertly guided by public policy' (144). In sum, Silcox contends that policy-makers should utilize a new 'type of noble lie' (142) -- deviating 'a little from scrupulous honesty', which may be 'excusable' if done 'systematically and with a benevolent purpose in mind' (145) -- for the sake of 'supporting and expanding the traditional redistributive functions of government' (135). Unfortunately, I must confess that upon imagining the many ways that policy-makers and governments might twist such 'noble' aims into problematically restrictive forms of social control (such as China's new social credit system), I simulated the experience that I have every time I read Plato's Republic: that utopian proposals like these are probably better left simulated.