A Future for Presentism

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Craig Bourne, A Future for Presentism, Oxford University Press, 2006, 242pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780199212804

Reviewed by Yuri Balashov, University of Georgia


Presentism is the doctrine that only present entities exist.  Eternalism--or the tenseless theory of time, as Craig Bourne prefers to call it--is the rival doctrine that past, present and future entities are ontologically on a par; some of them (e.g., Socrates) are just not "temporally here."  (Compare: Boston, MA is not spatially here, but that does not mean that Boston fails to exist, for that reason.)  Despite the fact that presentism has the firm backing of common sense and eternalism revolts against it, eternalism is widely regarded as almost the default view in contemporary debates, and presentism as a highly problematic view.  This is the time of revisionary ontologies.

Is there a future for presentism in such circumstances?  Craig Bourne thinks there is.  Unlike some other presentists, he does not think eternalism is utterly untenable; instead he thinks it is a theory to beat, and he takes up the formidable challenge of defending a version of presentism against all the odds.  His version--"ersatzer presentism," systematically developed in Chapter 2--is similar to some others in that it takes times to be abstract entities: maximally consistent sets of propositions of a certain type, which represent, in a relevant way, past, present and future states of affairs and their cross-temporal relations.  But although all times are, in this sense, real, only one of them has a concrete realization.  The analogy with "magical" modal actualism is obvious.  Bourne argues this allows the theory to have its cake and eat it too: to have a full range of times without being committed to the existence of full-blown concrete non-present entities, such as Socrates or dinosaurs.  Bourne thinks the former gives the ersatzer presentist all the means necessary to deal with a battery of standard objections having to do with transtemporal relations and the alleged need to invoke past and future objects and events (Chapters 3 and 4).

There are two separate problems here.  One concerns the need to talk about non-present objects and to ascribe properties to them.  The other has to do with the need to invoke relations among entities located (as we eternalists would say) at different times.  If only present entities exist, how does one pull off these tricks?  The first problem may be an easier one for the ersatzer and involves two important steps.  'Socrates was snub-nosed' is made true by an abstract fact, which is a member of a certain moment of past time (remember, times are abstract entities, sets of propositions), and is initially represented as 'P(∃x) (x = Socrates ∧ snub-nosed (x))'.  Here 'P' is the past-tense operator 'it was the case that' and '(∃x)' is the usual tenseless quantification, which, according to Bourne, must be recognized by presentists as having fundamental significance.  But one cannot stop here, for how can one refer to Socrates in the context of quantification?  The ersatzer presentist has two options here: the Russellian way which paraphrases statements about individuals with quantification phrases, or a non-Russellian alternative, such as that sketched by Bourne, which makes use of the causal-historical theory of naming.  According to the latter, what enables us to talk about Socrates is the fact that P(∃x) (∃y) (∃z) (x = Socrates ∧ refers to (y, x, z)), where x ranges over persons, y over initial baptizers, z over names, while refers to is a causal relation of the sort left to the philosophers of language to make precise.

Much depends, therefore, on the ersatzer presentist general account of causal relations, the topic considered in Chapter 4.  The discussion there spans a whole range of topics, including backwards causation, time travel and decision theory.  Bourne's general strategy is to avoid firm commitment to a particular theory of causation but to show instead that different such theories (e.g., the regularity theory as well as the counterfactual theory) can be accommodated within the presentist framework.  On the face of it, all such options require endorsement of cross-temporal relations.  This issue, which was briefly mentioned above, thus comes to the forefront. 

The guiding idea here is to deflate relations themselves as spurious while putting the main emphasis on the relata.  One important kind of cross-temporal relation includes the set of relations generating a B-series for the tenseless theorist.  Suppose th e B-theorist asserts that events e1 and e2 are simultaneous (in the present, past or future, as we would say).  How is the ersatzer presentist to represent this fact?  Bourne assigns this job to a conjunction of basic present-tense propositions p1 and p2 (the propositions that e1 occurs and that e2 occurs, respectively): (p1p2) ∨ P(p1p2) ∨ F(p1p2).  And where the B-theorist says that one past event e1 is earlier than another past event e2 ("past" -- relative to a chosen vantage point, of course), the ersatzer presentist will represent this as: Pm(p1p1*) ∧ Pn(p2p2*) ∧ m>n, where m,nR, Pm and Pn are metric tense operators, and p1* and p2* are the propositions that events e1* and e2* occur, respectively, where these are simultaneous with e1 and e2, respectively.  The B-series is thus apparently reduced to basic logical operations, fundamental present-tense propositions and relations between real numbers.  But note the need to invoke e1* and e2* to express a simple fact about e1 and e2.  One wonders what the former have to do with the latter.  The tenseless theorist has no need to pose such extraneous events in order to express a cross-temporal relation earlier than.  The presentist appears to be at a disadvantage here.

Be that as it may, once the B-series is in place, causation, no matter how it is construed, can probably be accommodated.  What about purely qualitative cross-temporal relations, such as that involved in 'Bourne admires Plato'?  Assuming that the subject of admiration is Plato himself (and not his achievements, as the case might be: that case constitutes no problem whatsoever for the presentist), Bourne notes that, pace some critics of presentism, the problem here lies not in the spurious relation of admiration, but in the need to talk about, or refer to, Plato and other past objects, and that problem has already been dealt with.

But can all cross-temporal relations be thus reduced to their relata?  Are all cross-temporal relations, in this sense, internal?  Consider motion in the Galilean spacetime (see Sider 2001, 27ff).  Motion supervenes on spacetime locations and their metric relations, and the latter constitute a paradigm example of an external relation (between regions of spacetime or directly between events, if one is a relationalist about spacetime).  Suppose we have two cases of motion: accelerated and unaccelerated.  In the eternalist framework the difference is brought out by the fact that the worldline of the object in the first case is straight, and in the second curved.  But how will the presentist represent the difference, given that she lacks the freedom to talk about different moments of time "at once"?

Other problems abound.  The eternalist who is serious about sets (and thinks, in particular, that a set exists only if its members do) would easily grant the existence of a set containing a dinosaur and a computer, but the presentist, even equipped with the resources of Bourne's theory, would reject the disjunction 'P((∃x) (x is a set containing a dinosaur and a computer)) ∨ (∃x) (x is a set containing a dinosaur and a computer) ∨ F((∃x) (x is a set containing a dinosaur and a computer))' (see Sider 2001, 15-16). 

But one should not think that only the presentist has a hard time.  When it comes to explaining important phenomenological data it is the eternalist who faces an uphill battle.  Bourne begins his "Presentist Manifesto" (Part I of the book) with a discussion of the famous problem of the presence of experience (he refers to is as "the Present Problem").  On eternalism, our conscious experiences at different times have the same ontological status: they all tenselessly occur at their respective dates.  But we do not experience all of them on a par.  In fact, we tend to believe that only our present experiences are real, to the exclusion of our past and future experiences.  The eternalist must maintain that this belief is an illusion and explain the origin of the illusion.  The presentist, on the contrary, has an easy time explaining this belief, because the belief is simply true and reflects an objective fact about the world: we think that only our present experiences are real because only they are real.  This much is clear.  But it appears that Bourne grants the eternalist more than the latter is due when Bourne notes that, once the indexical nature of expressions such as 'now', 'our time', 'this experience' and the like is taken into account, the eternalist has an equally good solution to the problem of the presence of experience: although this time is not ontologically privileged, it is the only time when I can have this experience.  But this is too quick.  The real problem lies, not in explaining the correlation between this time and this experience, but in explaining the sheer occurrence of this experience (correlated with this time), rather than that experience (correlated with that time).  The eternalist cannot say that this time is present (for that time is equally present); nor can she say that this time is now (because that time is also now).  The problem remains.  If the eternalist is to restore explanatory parity with the presentist vis-à-vis the problem of the presence of experience, more needs to be said.

The entirety of Part II of the book is devoted to the hard task of defending presentism in the face of special and general relativity.  Chapter 5 provides a quick introduction to the relevant physics for a non-specialist.  Chapter 6 delves into the "Putnam-Stein debate" and, in my mind, does a good job showing that the metaphysical significance of this debate has been greatly exaggerated.  Putnam was concerned to show that tensed talk has no place in special relativity.  According to many commentators, Stein was concerned to preserve tensed talk in that context.  Bourne shows (convincingly, I think) that Stein and his followers misinterpreted the essence, and underestimated the commitments, of tensed talk, defending, instead, interesting formal results that are, however, entirely unhelpful to the presentist (or any A-theorist, for that matter).

This serves to highlight the real (and easy to understand) problem for the presentist who wants to be physics-friendly.  (It is no secret that some presentists--most notably, Prior--are, in their own words, physics-unfriendly.)  The presentist is committed to the following: when I click my finger on Alpha Centauri, Boris Yeltsin is either alive or dead.  But according to special relativity, there is simply no fact of the matter.  There is no global present moment cutting throughout the entire universe that has more than a frame-relative significance.  Or is there?  According to contemporary "neo-Lorentzians," it is possible to preserve the notion of absolute simultaneity (and, hence, of the absolute present) in the framework of special relativity without violating its letter.  Bourne joins the ranks of neo-Lorentzians.  But what he has to say in support of his stance is rather limited: a brief historical excursus into the case of Einstein versus Lorentz and Poincaré, which does not begin to do justice to the complexity of the case, and a rather misleading comment on the "conspiracy of silence" problem.  This is not the place to elaborate, but the reader is strongly advised to read what Bourne says about these historical and foundational issues against the background of recent authoritative scholarship.  (Good sources to start with are Janssen 2002a and 2002b.)

These defects are somewhat mitigated in Bourne's more helpful discussion of presentism's standing vis-à-vis general relativity and cosmology.  He begins by rightly discouraging presentists from deriving too much support from the "cosmic time" of isotropic and homogenous relativistic models of the universe.  For one thing, the notion of the uniform cosmological time arises only in the smoothened-out idealized models; it is far from clear that our universe is like that.  More importantly, it is utterly unclear what relation, if any, the cosmological time may bear to the phenomenological local time, which is the real source of many issues surrounding presentism.  Having made these points, Bourne turns, finally, to Gödel's famous spacetime models featuring closed timelike curves, which are not susceptible to partitioning into global hypersurfaces of simultaneity.  To put the matter in the modal language, worlds that include closed timelike curves have no place for presentism and tense.  Is tense a merely contingent feature of time?  If so, what are time's essential properties, if any?  To find out, read Bourne's book to the end.  Overall, it is a useful contribution to the flourishing presentism industry.




Janssen, Michel (2002a): "Reconsidering a Scientific Revolution: The Case of Einstein versus Lorentz." Physics in Perspective 4: 421-446.

Janssen, Michel (2002b): "COI Stories: Explanation and Evidence from Copernicus to Hockney." Perspectives on Science 10: 457-522.

Sider, Theodore (2001): Four-Dimensionalism. An Ontology of Persistence and Time. Oxford: Clarendon Press.