A Genealogy of Marion's Philosophy of Religion: Apparent Darkness

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Tamsin Jones, A Genealogy of Marion's Philosophy of Religion: Apparent Darkness, Indiana University Press, 2011, 235pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253222862.

Reviewed by Karmen MacKendrick, Le Moyne College


The title and subtitle of Tamsin Jones' A Genealogy of Marion's Philosophy of Religion: Apparent Darkness neatly encapsulate the various elements brought together in this tidy and carefully structured book. Its central argument is that while some of the influences on Jean-Luc Marion's work (such as Descartes and Husserl) are well known and well studied, there has been significant neglect of his use of patristic figures; and that this use helps us to rethink both the consistencies and the tensions in his thought.

More precisely, Jones argues for, and performs, an analysis of Marion's employment of Pseudo-Dionysius (sixth century) and Gregory of Nyssa (fourth century). Such an analysis, as she demonstrates, helps us to understand Marion's philosophy in a way that does not insistently distinguish its phenomenological and theological elements, but shows how they are interwoven. That these are in fact coherent elements is a second, though closely related, argument. The apparent darkness alerts us to the element of paradox that we might well expect in a text dealing with either of those two late ancient figures, but here the phrase is applied to Marion's work as well. Jones argues for an element of paradox in that work -- and is careful to distinguish paradoxicality from incoherence, asking where and whether the work might veer from the former to the latter. The book is carefully balanced, neither glorifying nor denouncing Marion's work, and its arguments are elegantly supported.

The book begins by pointing out that the division that many scholars make between the theological and phenomenological elements of Marion's work may miss an underlying coherence -- which is not to deny that there are tensions. Marion's use of apophatic patristic sources may provide a way to clarify both the coherence and the tensions. This book is not a work of apologetics, however, nor does it try to explain away possible contradictions. The deeper or more genuine tension that remains in Marion's thought, Jones argues, is not between theology and phenomenology, but between the imperative that Marion takes over from Husserl, to return to "the things themselves," and the attempt to free those things, those phenomena, from all constraints, including those of subjectivity. Showing the possible falsity of one tension, then, allows us to explore another, which may run more deeply.

Jones' opening chapter refines her claim for a significant patristic influence on Marion's work. In fact, she makes two connected claims here. She notes critically that Marion tends not to distinguish Pseudo-Dionysius from Gregory of Nyssa in his retrieval of both as sources of "orthodoxy;" indeed, the Church "Fathers serve an apologetic function" (43) without much distinction between them. This univocal retrieval is not unproblematic, and Jones points out that "Marion actually allows Gregory to 'speak' in the place of Dionysius in crucial moments of exposition of the latter" (13). In support of these theses, this chapter traces the development of Marion's work from his early essays onward, noting along the way the problem that Dionysian hierarchicality presents for Marion's insistence that there cannot be levels of being. In general, Jones argues, Marion reads Dionysius astutely, but occasionally he manipulates ideas or phrases a little more than the texts can really support, in order to get them to mean what is useful to him.

To argue strongly that Marion elides real differences between these patristic figures requires a clear sense of those differences, and this is what chapter two offers. Specifically, this chapter compares the relation of apophaticism to limit in Dionysius and Gregory. Through a careful survey of primary texts and important secondary sources, Jones argues for distinctions in philosophies of language (is it conventional or divinely sourced?), in cosmologies (infinite distance and movement, or harmoniously ordered hierarchy), and in the ways in which each figure worries about idolatry, which "Gregory fights . . . with the insistence of never stopping, never arriving . . . whereas Dionysius guards against idolatry by demanding that one stay within the bounds of possible and permissible exploration" (77). This last is especially significant for Marion, whose own concerns with idolatry lead him to identify with both of these thinkers -- despite their sometimes sharp differences -- in his support of positions he regards as properly orthodox.

Accordingly, the next two chapters place Marion in relation first to Dionysius and then to Gregory. The former requires a careful working-out of Marion's version of the phenomenological method, the tensions of which lead to "a nuanced and yet uneven retrieval of Dionysius the Areopagite" (98). From Dionysius, Jones argues, Marion takes both a theologically aesthetic approach "that enables the appearance of 'transcendent' phenomena without, nonetheless, entailing their circumscription," and the concept of language as both revelatory and concealing, governed by the logic of the gift that is so central to Marion's thought. But Jones takes Marion to task for his insufficient attention to "the broad nexus of cosmology, hierarchy, and apophaticism" (99) in Dionysius's work, an inattention that leads Marion to take Dionysian ideas at times out of context, or to come up with not entirely justified readings or translations (notably "requisite" for aetia, more commonly rendered "cause" [98-100]). Ultimately, Marion is troubled by the hierarchicality that is fundamental to the very elements of Dionysius that he wants to retrieve and to use. It is Marion's desire for certainty and a universal method that leads him to a less nuanced reading than that of which, as Jones notes through her readings of some of Marion's early texts, he is clearly capable.

If the pull of epistemological certitude and universality draws Marion to Dionysius, the opposing (though not contradictory) pull of hermeneutical interpretation, especially the interpretation of saturated phenomena, is what draws him to Gregory of Nyssa. Marion's response to criticisms of the possibility of reading saturated phenomena -- those epiphanic or revelatory phenomena that seem to exceed the very categories of experience -- has not been quite satisfactory, Jones suggests. More attention to Gregory's work might help in addressing these issues. Jones first lays out Marion's claims regarding saturated phenomena and important criticisms of them, and then turns to Gregory's theory of scriptural interpretation "in order to provide a more concrete analysis of what a derivative hermeneutics of revelation might look like" (121). Gregory's theory of language as always inherently interpretive and never quite complete offers a "missed opportunity" (128) to Marion, whose idea of interpretation is subsequent to, not inherent in, the given.

With these lines of argument in place, Jones turns to the apophatic or "dark" element not of Marion's sources, but of his own phenomenology, arguing that Marion has blind spots regarding "the tensions in his own thought as well as . . . the different ontologies imported in his retrieval of the fathers" (130). She argues that a more explicit use of Gregory's work could help Marion negotiate the tensions between the hermeneutical and phenomenological, and between worldly saturated phenomena and God as saturated phenomenon. Despite these critical considerations, Jones argues that Marion's sense of saturation is potentially transformative and merits careful attention as "an enticing invitation to wonder, to allow an openness to experience, rigorous in that it forbids nothing and pre-determines no limitation to what might come except the non-limit of what love might receive" (154).

The book's conclusion summarizes in detail what has been presented previously and remarks upon issues inviting further study. These issues particularly involve the ways in which phenomena are received -- the ways in which we might prepare ourselves for such receipt, and how (and whether) we might make value judgments regarding phenomena. The retrieval of the church fathers is (qualifiedly) defended as valuable to Marion's broadly "apologetic" project. Acknowledging the negative valence of this term for us, Jones argues for a sense of apologetics that is not convinced in advance of its accuracy but is precisely open to conversation and debate -- a characteristic, she argues, modeled in Marion's own thought.

The argument of A Genealogy of Marion's Philosophy of Religion is fairly contained and small, a wise strategy but one to which, as many of us know, it is nonetheless often difficult to discipline oneself. This allows for an admirable level of detail, support, and clarity. Much of the text works to line up support for the arguments that it makes, in the form of background information and summaries of scholarship on its three key figures. The work that results is remarkably clear, its sections subdivided with what is at times a downright Thomistic precision (this is meant as a compliment), offering in its analytic tidiness a rather engaging contrast with the apophatic and elusive materials it considers. Introductory and concluding summaries in each chapter as well as in the book as a whole have just the right level of detail.

Readers who, like this reviewer, have occasionally used historical sources with knowing partiality may be a little hesitant to engage fully Jones's criticisms of Marion's use of key patristic figures, criticisms grounded in Marion's overly-creative or too-strong readings of some texts and perhaps intentional omission of others. There are times when the text does seem to assume that Marion has set out to be a scholar of the figures he cites, rather than one who creatively appropriates those figures to another use; this may well be correct, and I raise the point as one of curiosity rather than quibbling. Jones's case is strong, not only because we are all aware of the potential pitfalls of such choices, but because the orthodoxy of the historical figures is so important for grounding Marion's sense of his own -- orthodoxy does not so readily allow for selectivity as heterodox or polydox readings do.

A Genealogy of Marion's Philosophy of Religion will enrich the reading of Marion's work, particularly for scholars interested in a sense of historical grounding, but also for those engaged in issues of interdisciplinarity. It will be helpful to those who continue to rethink phenomenology, especially, but not only, in light of theology. Scholars of late antiquity are not likely to take up the arguments as newly contributing to the study of the Church fathers, but that is not what the arguments are meant to do here; phenomenologists, who have not much used these resources before, might well be intrigued by those very considerations. Interestingly, the book's subject might also be one of the readers most benefited and enriched by it, should he take seriously the possibility of foregrounding Gregory's work.