A History of Irish Thought

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Duddy, Thomas, A History of Irish Thought, Routledge, 2002, 384pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415206936.

Reviewed by Dermot Moran, University College Dublin


In this lucidly written and timely book, Thomas Duddy—Lecturer in Philosophy in University College Galway—attempts to address the vexed issue of the existence of an Irish intellectual tradition. It is vexed, because an earlier effort to map the same terrain— The Irish Mind edited by my colleague Richard Kearney (a volume in which I participated) and acknowledged by Duddy—was attacked, unjustly, by Conor Cruise O’Brien as attempting to claim there was such a thing as a national ‘mind’ or spirit. I do not recall books with titles such as ‘The Spirit of American Philosophy’ being similarly attacked. Nobody disputes that Ireland made small, isolated contributions to the intellectual heritage of the West, what is at issue is whether there is a specifically Irish intellectual tradition. Defining tradition is never easy. It was the Duke of Wellington, who, when reminded that he was born in Ireland, remarked: ‘Just because one is born in a stable does not make one a horse’. Nevertheless, it is possible to detect certain intellectual current in Irish cultural history that can be said to add up to a tradition, provided we do not seek what Duddy calls an ‘imperial’ vision of tradition that presupposes “privileged identities or privileged periods of social and cultural evolution” (p. xii). Duddy argues, correctly I believe, that the very fractured nature of the Irish historical experience, characterized by invasion, plantation and upheaval, will mean inevitably that many Irish philosophers will develop their work in exile outside Ireland (as is the case with Eriugena). Others, such as Robert Boyle, will be ‘Irish by privilege’, that is, they were born in Ireland and able to develop their scientific interests because of their inherited wealth, gained as landlords in Ireland. Duddy has a category for the likes of the Iron Duke, they are—and here he includes Swift—‘accidental’ Irishmen.

There have been considerable efforts to study individual Irish philosophers and some particular historical periods. The Society for the Promotion of Eriugena Studies (founded in Dublin in 1970) has been successful in reviving interest in John Scottus Eriugena (c.800-877); David Berman has considerably advanced knowledge of the so-called ‘Irish Enlightenment’ figures of the eighteenth century, and Philip McGuinness, Alan Harrison, Richard Kearney and Andrew Carpenter, among others, have been active in promoting John Toland. The Royal Irish Academy has in train a project attempting to document the Irish contribution to the sciences. But the full extent of Ireland’s intellectual history has not even been sketched in outline, never mind explored in depth. For this reason, the current book, although but an opening statement in a debate that will surely run, is especially welcome.

Duddy, wisely, does not attempt to limit his study to philosophy ancient and modern (John Scottus Eriugena, John Toland, George Berkeley, Francis Hutcheson, Iris Murdoch, John Wisdom), but includes scientists (Robert Boyle, William Molyneux, John Tyndall), literary figures (Jonathan Swift, Oscar Wilde, George Bernard Shaw, William Butler Yeats), political theorists and activists (Edmund Burke, Daniel O’Connell, James Connolly) as well as some neglected figures who were influential in their day, such as Michael Moore and George Ensor. Moore (1640-1726) was a Paris educated, anti-Cartesian Scholastic, who was briefly the first Catholic Provost of Trinity College Dublin, and twice Rector of the University of Paris. Ensor (1769-1843), a friend of Bentham and Daniel O’Connell, promoted, in his The Principles of Morality (1801), the idea that morality was independent of religion.

Duddy begins his story with the so called ‘Irish Augustine’, an anonymous seventh-century Biblical commentator whose De mirabilibus sacrae scripturae was included in early editions of Saint Augustine. This author is interesting in that he tries to give a rational account of the creation of the world, addressing such questions as the reason why only land animals were destroyed in the Flood. He also offers an analysis of miracles in keeping with recognition of the consistency of nature, which God does not try to interfere with or amend. Duddy could have also discussed Sedulius Scottus and Dicuil as early representative of Irish intellectual tradition, but in particular a discussion of Patrick is missing. Although not an intellectual by any means, Patrick’s Confessio is an extraordinary document of Irish Christianity, and one well worth studying in the light of the long Christian tradition, which comes after it.

Duddy’s second chapter is devoted to the Middle Ages and focuses on the ninth-century Christian Neoplatonist Johannes Scottus Eriugena, but includes brief discussions of the Irish Neo-Aristotelian, Peter of Ireland, teacher of Thomas Aquinas, and the brilliant Richard Fitzralph. Duddy writes solidly and interestingly on Eriugena , including a discussion of the accusation of pantheism.

Chapter Three focuses on the new scientific achievements of Robert Boyle and William Molyneux. Boyle, born in Lismore Castle, County Waterford, in 1627, is portrayed as a materialist mechanist and staunch critic of Scholastic explanation in terms of formal causes, but who nevertheless thought that the contemplation of the universe as a vast and regular machine was actually an aid to the appreciation of the magnificent work of God. It is good to see William Molyneux’s famous problem of the blind man whose sight has been restored being properly recognized as an Irish contribution to philosophy. On July 7 1688 Molyneux, founder of the Dublin Philosophical Society and later Member of Parliament representing Trinity College, author of the Dioptrica Nova (London, 1692) and The Case of Ireland’s Being Bound by Acts of Parliament in England Stated (Dublin, 1698), first posed the problem in a letter to John Locke, who subsequently discussed it in the second edition (1694) of his Essay Concerning Human Understanding Book Two, Chapter Nine, § 8. Molyneux originally posed the question as follows:

A Man, being born blind, and having a Globe and a Cube, nigh of the same bigness, Committed into his Hands, and being taught or Told, which is Called the Globe, and which the Cube, so as easily to distinguish them by his Touch or Feeling; Then both being taken from Him, and Laid on a Table, Let us suppose his Sight Restored to Him; Whether he Could, by his Sight, and before he touch them, know which is the Globe and which is the Cube? Or Whether he Could know by his Sight, before he stretched out his Hand, whether he Could not Reach them, tho they were Removed 20 or 1000 feet from him?

Descartes in the Dioptrics had already discussed a blind man ‘seeing’ the path in front with the aid of a stick tapping the ground. The assumption is that the blind man is using a certain innate geometry to calculate and envisage distance. Both Locke and Molyneux thought the blind man presented with the sight of a cube and sphere would not be able to know what he sees on the basis of what he had previously only known by touch. For Locke, the blind man would not yet know that a property accessible by touch could also be available to sight. This problem continues to resonate in philosophical discussion and even has an outing in Brian Friel’s 1994 play Molly Sweeney.

Chapter Four is devoted to John Toland (1670-1722), a fascinating character, an independent scholar and man of letters, a relentless pamphleteer and polemicist, who campaigned on Republican, Anti-Monarchist, and Anti-Popery issues. He published essays on numismatics, economics, politics, classics, and comparative religion, on the Druids, the Egyptians, the Celts and the American Indians. An associate of John Locke, Molyneux, the notoriously anti-religious Prince Eugene of Savoy, and Sophia of Hanover, he made his living as an ‘author-monger’ and was famous in his own time for his great edition of the works of John Milton, including the prose works (1697-8), and for his biography, The Life of Milton (1699). He also translated and championed Giordano Bruno. He was a skilful manipulator of sources, wrote anonymous and pseudonymous works, adopting different voices and masks. He was, of course, accused of undermining Christianity and authority, and he may have been a spy for the house of Hanover.

John Toland was a native Irish speaker from the Inish Owen peninsula, whose conversion to Protestantism in 1686 at the age of fifteen released him from his sheep tending to attend a Protestant academy in nearby Redcastle, where his sponsors envisioned him as a future missionary to Gaelic-speaking peoples. Supposedly destined to a life as a divine, he was further educated in Glasgow University (1687-1690), where, however, he aligned himself with the Presbyterians, and supported William of Orange. He was even awarded a certificate for joining anti-Jacobite protests on the barricades in Glasgow during the Glorious Revolution of 1689. In 1689 he moved to the University of Edinburgh and received his MA in Theology the day before the battle of the Boyne. He then went to London seeking sponsorship. Indeed, Toland always depended on generosity of whatever sponsors he could accumulate.

Toland should be celebrated as a champion of feminism for his essay on Hypatia, the Neoplatonic philosopher murdered by followers of St. Cyril. His anti-clericalism is stronger even than Voltaire’s, and his most famous work, Christianity Not Mysterious (1696), is now justly regarded as the first shot in the Enlightenment. Indeed, writing from Amsterdam in December 1709, Toland claimed that the key to all his works was the destruction of prejudices. He corresponded and befriended John Locke, Leibniz, Molyneux, and others. Berkeley and Swift both knew of him but disapproved. Leibniz, who was interested in his metaphysical speculations, recognized him as ‘homme d’esprit et de savoir’ and it is reputed that Leibniz learned Irish from him.

Duddy rightly situates Toland’s defense of reason in Christianity in the context of Locke’s work. Duddy points out that Toland was not an atheist and indeed his target was always ‘priestcraft’ (a delicious word still in regular use in the anti-Catholic sermons of the Reverend Ian Paisley) rather than religion. Indeed, Toland agreed with Hobbes that the worship of god was natural for humans.

Rather surprisingly, Duddy devotes only half of Chapter Five to Ireland’s best-known philosopher George Berkeley, perhaps because he is so well known. The second half of the chapter is devoted to Jonathan Swift and is entitled (in a phrase borrowed from Swift) ‘Wonderfully Mending the World’. Berkeley sought to mend the world by ridding it of scepticism and atheism by the elimination of what he took to be a scientific conjecture, namely, matter; Swift sought to mend the world through exposing its moral hypocrisies.

Duddy focuses on Berkeley’s radically empiricist theory of vision, with its denial that the eye employs any inbuilt geometry to calculate distance and his definition of objects in terms of their perceived properties, and on his theological arguments for God and for a kind of fideism. The account is straightforward, but it is clear that Duddy has little sympathy for Berkeley and so his account does not really come to life. Although he does discuss Berkeley’s analysis of religious language, he does not allude to the importance of Berkeley as an early philosopher of language. But a prominent theme of Berkeley’s 1710 Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge is ‘the nature and abuse of language’ (Introduction § 6). Indeed Berkeley writes in Principles § 89:

Nothing seems of more importance, towards erecting a firm system of sound and real knowledge, which may be proof against the assaults of scepticism, than to lay the beginning in a distinct explication of what is meant by thing, reality, existence: for in vain shall we dispute concerning the real existence of things, or pretend to any knowledge thereof, so long as have not fixed the meaning of those words.

The fixing of the meaning of words (including the meaning of ‘matter’) is more important to Berkeley’s project than Duddy recognizes.

Duddy’s discussion of Swift (“a profoundly anti-intellectual and reactionary thinker, and none the less brilliant for being so”, p. 167) is altogether better and more expansive. It recognizes the moral power of Swift’s satires on intellectual pretensions in The Battle of the Book s, . Tale of a Tub and Gulliver’s Travels. Swift sides with the ancients (including Aristotle) against the moderns (Bacon, Hobbes, Descartes), and his satire on the relentless quantification of modern science (e.g. in the weighing and analyzing of excrement) is all part of a larger suspicion of the project of reason. Swift then is the intellectual opponent of Toland.

Chapter Six is a very welcome discussion of the benevolent moral views of Francis Hutcheson (1694-1746) and also an account of Edmund Burke’s views on aesthetics and on the nature of community and society. Hutcheson is not often recognized as an Irish philosopher. Born in County Down, he ran a dissenter’s academy in Dublin, before moving in 1729 to the University of Glasgow, where he taught Adam Smith, among others. Burke is treated as an aesthetician of the sublime and as a conservative defender of tradition. In contrast to the great Protestant Enlightenment and Counter-Enlightenment in the eighteenth-century (limited to Northern Ireland and Dublin), the nineteenth century was a period of Catholic resurgence. Despite Duddy’s focus here on the formative influences on Daniel O’Connell’s political outlook, most of the figures he discusses—William Thomson, John Tyndall, and Yeats—were all drawn from the Protestant Ascendancy. It would have been good here to have a discussion of the impact of the arrival of John Henry Newman in Dublin to set up University College as the Catholic University.

As we move towards the twentieth century, there is a rather surprising thinning out of material. The new Irish state did not produce great intellectuals, even as it did produce great writers and Nobel Prize winners. The book ends with a somewhat limited discussion of some contemporary Irish philosophers, specifically Iris Murdoch, William Desmond (currently at Leuven), and Philip Pettit (currently at Princeton). Duddy characterizes Desmond and Pettit as both concerned with moral and political approaches to human nature: Desmond concerned with human vulnerability, pain and tragedy, Pettit, writing in a very different vein, analyzing the nature of action. I believe this section should have included Richard Kearney, who studied in Paris with Paul Ricoeur, for his influential hermeneutic discussions of imagination and the nature of Irish identity. Similarly, there is a small but significant number of Irish-born philosophers working around the world; one could cite Onora O’Neill at Cambridge; Ernan McMullin and Cyril O’Regan at Notre Dame, and, indeed, the classicist Terence Irwin, all of whom could have been included; but these are minor quibbles.

The book has many virtues. First among them is readability: Duddy writes with an admirably clear, uncluttered prose style. Second is range: Duddy has made an enormous contribution to the intellectual history of Ireland by taking on so many diverse figures. Sometimes, however, this very range and diversity challenges the possibility of a single narrative. Duddy does not face directly the question of the competing Catholic and Protestant traditions in Ireland, nor does he have much to say on the social and institutional factors that promoted or inhibited intellectual development. Sometimes, Duddy’s own criteria of Irishness are too strict and it might have been worthwhile broadening them to allow for the discussion of philosophy in Ireland. In that sense, I would have liked to have seen a chapter on the Austrian Ludwig Wittgenstein because he composed much of the Philosophical Investigations living in isolation in Redcross, County Wicklow, in Carraroe, County Galway and in a hotel in miserable post-war Dublin (where the palm house in the Botanic Gardens, one of the few heated buildings in Dublin at the time, was a favorite place for him to sit with his notebook). Instead Duddy discusses Wittgenstein’s friend, and the man responsible for bringing him to Ireland, Maurice O’Connor Drury, although he was actually born in England of Irish parents. Similarly, it would have been nice to include the logician George Boole (1815-1864), born in Lincoln, but who served as professor of mathematics in Queen’s College, Cork, where he died. Finally, the Polish philosopher and logician Jan Lukasiewicz (1878-1956) lived in Ireland for a number of years and is buried in Dublin. An international conference celebrating his work was held in University College Dublin in 1996, organized by Maria Baghramian.

The concluding section on contemporary Irish thinkers could have included Conor Cruise O’Brien, even if only to acknowledge his work on Camus. Critics may well wish to query Duddy’s sense of the relative importance of some of his figures; nevertheless, as a first run through of this essentially uncharted domain, Duddy’s book is an impressive achievement and deserves a wide audience, including all those interested in Irish culture.