A History of Philosophy in America 1720-2000

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Kuklick, Bruce, A History of Philosophy in America 1720-2000, Oxford, 2001, 346pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199260168.

Reviewed by Richard M. Gale , University of Pittsburgh


This history of American philosophy from 1720 through 2000 displays the erudition, philosophical sensitivity, and boldness that we have come to associate with the work of Bruce Kuklick, the premier historian of American philosophy. The great density of the account precludes anyone just reading through the book (twenty pages a night is about all you can manage), but it is an invaluable reference source. The book’s dustjacket misleads when it says that “here at last is an American counterpart to Bertrand Russell’s History of Western Philosophy.” For whereas Kuklick never displays Russell’s philosophical genius and does not confine himself just to the famous philosophers, he would not be fair game for a law suit if some of the people he wrote about should come back to life. A better comparison would be with John Passmore’s One Hundred Years of Philosophy with regard to detail and ability to say a lot in very few words – a history of philosophy without foreplay.

Kuklick’s initial definition of “philosophy” as a “more or less systematic writing about the point of our existence, and our ability to understand the world of which we are a part” (x) might explain some significant and, in my opinion, highly questionable, omissions. Not a word is said, for example, about the work of Reichenbach, Grünbaum, Earman, Sklar, Friedman and Malament on space and time, or about the efforts of Hempel, Salmon and a host of others to analyze explanation, as well as the development of modal logic and the semantics of possible worlds by Kripke and Lewis. What makes these omission especially irksome is that many of the philosophers to whom considerable space is accorded are not worthy of erasing the blackboards or emptying the waste baskets of these philosophers. The title of the book needs to be restricted so as to let the reader know that it does not cover the more technical work that has been done in the philosophy of science and logic. Another serious omission, but one that is not due to Kuklick’s big-picture definition of “philosophy,” is his completely ignoring the golden age of philosophical defenses of theism by analytic philosophers in the last third of the twentieth century, led primarily by Plantinga and Alston and a very large cast of able supporting players.

At the outset Kuklick declares that “it is not clear that anything unique characterizes American thought” (xi). Although he places great emphasis on the background culture of a philosophy, he adds that “I am not certain that a causal relation always exists between this matrix and the thinking” (xi). Thus, Kuklick makes no attempts, as many have, to show that classical pragmatism, at least at the time it was formulated, was an expression of something uniquely American. Kuklick’s caution may disappoint some readers, but maybe he is right about this. The underlying thesis of the book is that American philosophy displays a “long circuitous march from a religious to a secular vision of the universe” (xi). “One might presume that the march would diminish the role of the mental, often a term only a step away from the spiritual or religious. But despite the growing emphasis on the nonreligious, the deference to one or another kind of idealism has meant in America that realism (the view that physical objects at least exist independently of mind) has often been on the defensive, although a constant option. The eccentric journey away from religion has meant only the slow growth of what is often thought to be realism’s cousin, materialism – that monistic position opposed to idealism stipulating that the mental world is reducible to the physical” (xiii).

Part I deals with speculative thought in America from 1720 to 1868. There are separate chapters on Jonathan Edwards, who is the only one in the bunch who comes across as worth reading, philosophy and politics, the theological disputes involving Joseph Bellamy and Nathaniel William Taylor, collegiate philosophy from John Witherspoon to Noah Porter, and innovative amateurs, in particular James Marsh. Part II deals with the age of pragmatism from 1859 to 1934 and sees Darwin as the critical factor in the demise of the religious orientation of American philosophers. It is here that the book comes to life. The two major figures in the dominance of idealism from 1870 to 1900, Royce and Dewey, are featured. Some might have preferred a continuous account of Dewey’s development, rather than Kuklick’s disjointed one, since so many of the key doctrines of the early Dewey are retained in his later instrumentalism. Royce is made to appear more important than he was by the vastly exaggerated claim that the arguments he laid out early in his career “would dominate epistemology for well over a century” (122). This overestimation of Royce also is found in Kuklick’s decision to rate “Josiah Royce over Alfred North Whitehead” as a metaphysician, and thus to consider Royce’s metaphysics to the exclusion of Whitehead’s (xii). This is most unfortunate, for, not only is there no need to deal with one of them to the exclusion of the other, there is no doubt that Whitehead has had a far greater and lasting impact than has Royce, which is the only criterion for measuring the greatness of a philosopher. Two chapters are devoted to the pragmatism at Cambridge from 1867 to 1923, which includes the Metaphysical Club, Peirce, and an especially insightful exposition of James. This is followed by a chapter on instrumentalism in Chicago and New York from 1903 to 1934. Part III concerns professional philosophy from 1912 to 2000. An excellent exposition is given of professional realism from 1912 to 1956, in particular the New Realism and Critical Realism. Of special note is the insightful manner in which Kuklick brings out the connection between Roy Wood Sellars and his son, Wilfrid Sellars. The next chapter traces Europe’s impact on the United States from 1928 to 1964 as a result of the Frankfurt School, logical empiricism, and existentialism. The connection between Harvard and Oxford from 1946 to 1975 gives prominence to Goodman and Quine and the rise of analytic philosophy. The book ends with a brilliant chapter on the tribulations of professional philosophy from 1962 to 1999, which is must reading for everyone in the profession of philosophy.