A History of Women's Political Thought in Europe, 1400-1700

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Jacqueline Broad and Karen Green, A History of Women's Political Thought in Europe, 1400-1700, Cambridge UP, 2009, xi +334pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521888172.

Reviewed by Eileen O'Neill, University of Massachusetts-Amherst



Several decades of work by philosophers in women’s intellectual history have recently begun to influence scholarship and pedagogy in our field. An introductory textbook in philosophy now might include Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia’s criticisms of Descartes’ views about mind-body interaction or Mme de Staël’s theory of the passions.1 Courses in early modern philosophy increasingly include the work of philosophers such as Mary Astell, Margaret Cavendish, Catharine Trotter Cockburn, Anne Conway or Marie de Gournay.2 Yet Jacqueline Broad and Karen Green, the authors of this state-of-the-art history of women’s contributions to European political philosophy, open their book with the claim that histories of political thought “still tend to be about men — especially well-known men, such as Plato, Aristotle, Dante, Machiavelli, Hobbes, Locke and Rousseau” (2).3 The authors therefore aim in this book “to redress the imbalance by providing a history of women’s political thought in Europe from the late medieval to the early modern period” (2).

Perhaps the disparity between the absence of discussion of women’s political texts in the standard histories and the present authors’ wealth of evidence about the women’s significant contributions to the field can be sorted out by attention to historical methodology. Many of the histories of European political philosophy and most of the standard collections of central texts take the present as their point of departure and choose for inclusion those texts, views and arguments that have led to philosophical positions which are currently deemed central. Thus, given our current interest in questions concerning “power, the foundations and limits of political authority, the nature of political obligation, and the tensions between liberty and distributive justice”, these histories will take as canonical those figures and texts that focus on these issues (4). Broad and Green, however, make use of a historically contextualized methodology, one that attempts to reconstruct the thought of past philosophers in their own terms, to the extent to which this is possible. They aim at making intelligible the values, goals, presuppositions and lines of argumentation of the thinkers of the past — even if we now deem these to be problematic. Thus, one might think that the histories that exclude women political thinkers are simply engaged in a different sort of philosophical project than that of Broad and Green. But this does not explain why histories of political thought that use the historically contextualized methodology also fail to include women’s views,4 or why a book devoted to women in ancient, medieval and Renaissance political thought would take women to be the subject matter without including discussion of the views of women writers on this topic from this period.5

It is against this backdrop that Broad and Green offer us an alternative history of political thought, one that shows “that not all political writing in the pre-Enlightenment era renders women invisible, or fails explicitly to mention the female sex and their political subordination or exclusion” (3). They limit their historical survey to women theorists from Italy, France and England. They find that their history “expands the domain of the political in two respects. First, it returns to the ancient Aristotelian paradigm in which politics and ethics are united rather than opposed” (4). The authors claim that in modern political theory, the key concepts include the rights and obligations of sovereigns and subjects. Women writers, however, beginning in the fifteenth century, return to an Aristotelian and Stoic paradigm in which the key political concepts are not rights and obligations, but virtue and the good. This approach to politics “focuses on the appropriate character and virtues of members of the polis, on issues such as civic friendship, and the best organization for promoting the best kind of life” (5). Women writers took up this melding of ethics and politics, but argued against Aristotle’s view that women do not have the central political virtue of prudence and the capacity for just practical deliberations.

The second way this history “expands the domain of the political” is that it includes what we would now call “sexual politics” (4). A significant portion of the women’s writings focus on sexual relations between men and women, and issues involving marriage and love — issues that are not typically considered central ones in political philosophy. Further, they often chose to discuss these issues in more popular genres, such as poetry, novels and pamphlets, as well as in the more traditional political essay.

Finally, “by expanding the definition of the political, and with it the range of texts that count as political” the authors " have been led to uncover an autonomous tradition of women’s ideas" (291). The women

appreciated the existence of other women who were their intellectual forebears and models, and saw themselves as part of an alternative intellectual tradition. While they did not speak with a single ‘other voice’, we can see in their writings the outlines of a history of women’s ideas that develops both alongside and in counterpoint to the history of men’s ideas (292).

Later in this review I will discuss the two ways that our authors’ alternative history expands the classical understanding of the political, and the claim that this history uncovers an autonomous tradition of women’s political ideas. To do so, I first need to give readers a glimpse of the political views of some of the women writers included in this history.

The history begins with Christine de Pizan (1364-1430), who in a series of works develops a classically-inspired vision of good government grounded in virtue and an account of the prudent ruler.6 The authors argue that in Christine’s text, which is perhaps the most well-known today, The Book of the City of Ladies (1405), she supports “the claims of Isabeau de Bavière, Charles VI’s wife, to govern France as regent” and does so by arguing for “women’s prudence and capacity for governing themselves and others”. On Christine’s view, “women, as equal participants in God’s plan for humanity, will be included as equals in the quest for the common good” (27-28). The treatment of Christine is full of rich historical and interpretive detail, including discussion of the influence that the views of Dante, Boethius and others had on hers, and the authors mount an impressive case for the importance of Christine’s political thought. I do think, however, that it is important to see that in The Book of the City of Ladies Christine grounds her defense of women’s capacity for prudence, and for all the intellectual and moral virtues (which justify women participating in the struggle for achieving the common good) not only in experience and examples, but on arguments that draw on scriptural premises. This is important because parts of these arguments, or revisions of them, are offered by a number of subsequent women political thinkers covered in the history under review, as I will show. Christine’s arguments are a response both to a popular misogynist reading of 1 Cor. 11:7 (“Man is the image and glory of God, woman is the glory of man”), according to which human males alone are made in the image of God, as well as to the Aristotelian view that human female bodies are defective, imperfect male bodies.

Christine’s first argument is aimed at showing that women are made in the image of God and that their souls are equal in value to men’s. She notes that the misogynist view seems to assume that the “image of God” refers to the material body and thus that women, with their female bodies, are not made in God’s image. She argues, however, as follows:7

1. The image of God is nothing corporeal, but rather an immortal, intellectual soul.

2. When God created man and woman he “put completely equal souls, one as good and noble as the other, into the female and male bodies.”8

3. Therefore, woman was formed by God in his image. (1 and 2)

4. Therefore, woman’s soul is not less noble, but rather equal in value, to the soul of man. (2)

Christine’s second argument — in response to the Aristotelian charge that woman’s body is defective and less perfect than man’s, and a cause for shame — shows, however, that she does not argue for the equality of men and women in all respects. An implication of this argument is that women’s bodies are not only not defective, they are superior with respect to their material cause.

1. Woman’s body was made by the supreme craftsman, God.

2. God creates nothing defective. (unstated assumption)

3. God was not ashamed of his creation of the body of woman.

4. Therefore, woman’s body is neither defective nor a cause of shame.

5. The matter from which God formed man’s body was a lowly matter, clay; the matter from which God formed woman’s body was the noblest matter God had ever created, the body of man.9

6. The place of the creation of man’s body was a field in an ordinary earthly city, Damascus; the place of the creation of woman’s body was the most noble on earth, terrestrial paradise.

7. Therefore, in terms of its creator, matter and the place of its creation, woman’s body is not less perfect than man’s.

Christine’s argument for the equality of the souls of men and women, which turns on the soul as the image of God, appears in a revised form, and influenced by an Aristotelian understanding of soul as substantial form, in Marie de Gournay’s The Equality of Men and Women (1622).10 As we have seen, Christine does not argue for the equality of men and women in all respects, and Broad and Green suggest that Gournay’s text “may be the first essay to promote the equality of the sexes in exactly those terms” (134). In fact, as early as 1501, Mario Equicola’s De mulieribus argued that both the soul and the body of men and women have an identical origin, that men’s and women’s bodies are made out of a single material, that there is nothing superfluous or lacking in either men’s or women’s bodies — indeed their bodies are the same except for differences required for reproduction, and that men and women have an equal capacity for the intellectual and moral virtues.

Broad and Green do a superb job of tracing the influence of Montaigne’s political views on Gournay’s. Just as he does, she thinks there are limits to the human capacity to know the truth, which in turn fuels her religious toleration. Further, she agrees with him about the wisdom of conservatively following the laws and customs of one’s own society. But I part company with our authors insofar as they maintain that Gournay “followed Montaigne’s conservatism more readily than his scepticism” (129). I take Gournay seriously when she claims that in The Equality of Men and Women she will not prove her thesis “with arguments, since the opinionated might dispute them”. I take Gournay and Montaigne to be fideistic Pyrrhoneans. As a sceptic, Gournay thinks that it is sheer hubris to think that human reason can reveal scientific, metaphysical and moral truths via arguments. For each argument there is an equipollent one for the negation of its conclusion.11 So the arguments in Gournay’s treatise are not given as demonstrations of her thesis, but as part of sceptical therapy to help us stop looking to reason to reveal hidden truths. As a fideist, Gournay thinks that metaphysical and moral truths can only be known through God-given insight or through divine revelation in scripture. She accepts her thesis of the equality of men and women on faith, since it has been revealed in scripture, as interpreted by the tradition of the Catholic Church.12

Broad and Green introduce a figure into the history of political thought who is typically viewed merely as a literary writer, Marguerite de Navarre (1492-1549), and they focus on the developed gender politics in her fictional Heptameron. Here Marguerite attempts to counter the clerical representation of women as purely sexual beings by characterizing men as the ones primarily interested in sex, in contrast to women, who offer love. Perhaps most importantly, our authors suggest that Marguerite helps to transform the earlier Western view of marriage, as primarily a social and economic contract, into a relationship dependent on love. In this way, she contributes to the spiritual elevation of marriage — a project later taken up by Madeleine de Scudéry (1607-1701), among others.13 Our authors provide some textual and historical evidence that Marguerite might have read Christine’s works. As we will see, Marguerite de Narvarre becomes an important link in the chain that may constitute a tradition in women’s political philosophy that runs from Christine through to the end of the seventeenth century.

The final figure treated in this history is Mary Astell (1666-1731). Broad and Green do an outstanding job of elucidating the metaphysical and religious foundations of her political views, and indicating their relation to her positions on marriage and women’s education. For Astell, the self is the soul, and thus self-preservation consists in the soul’s salvation. Further, given her High Church Anglican views, my salvation is in my hands alone; in this sense my self-preservation cannot be transferred to another. For this reason, Astell thinks Locke’s contractarian account of the origins of political society makes no sense; I cannot entrust the power of self-preservation to other individuals or a ruler. Further, on Astell’s reading, divine revelation does not condone rebellion against earthly authority, which, by the divine right of kings, is also a rebellion against God. We must submit to the lawfully constituted political structures that have been providentially arranged by God.

Broad and Green further argue that in Some Reflections Upon Marriage (1700), Astell extends her views about passive obedience to the situation of women in marriage. She may be highlighting the hypocrisy of men in not uniformly upholding passive obedience in both the state and the home, or she may be arguing that theorists who detest the absolute power of sovereigns should detest the absolute power of husbands as well. In The Christian Religion (1705), Astell draws on the law of self-preservation — the right to preserve oneself from damnation — to convince women that they must study scripture for themselves and discover the foundations of their religious beliefs.

We are now in a position to evaluate Broad and Green’s claim that the women political philosophers in this history provide a “Christian synthesis of classical Aristotelian and Stoic political ideas”, in which the key political concepts are virtue and the good (6). I agree that virtue and the good play central roles in the women’s political theories. But while earlier figures, such as Christine de Pizan and Marie de Gournay, who were writing from the perspective of a politically and religiously unified view about virtue, do seem to have relied on the classical paradigm in which politics and ethics are united, it is not clear to me that women writers later in the seventeenth century fall into this classification. For example, there seems to be a tension between Astell’s religious position that it is a virtue to fulfill one’s Christian duty to interpret scripture by using one’s own understanding and, on the other hand, her conservative, politically grounded view that individual biblical interpretation must ultimately bow to the judgment of the divinely instituted monarch and religious authorities.14 Further, as Broad and Green themselves point out, the Quaker women of this period, such as Margaret Fell Fox (1614-1702), argue that women are equally as virtuous as men, are men’s equals within the religious sphere, and are thus fit to preach, yet they also argue that women should be subordinated to men not just within marriage but in the polis in general. But if women are equally as virtuous as men, why should they not be men’s equals in the polis? These Quaker women seem not to be adopting the Aristotelian paradigm in which the key concept in politics is virtue, but rather a religious paradigm in which the key concept in politics is divine command, as understood through scripture.

Nevertheless I do agree with Broad and Green that the women political philosophers in this history all discuss what we would now call “sexual politics”, as can be seen from the snapshots of the few figures given in this review. Broad and Green may also be right in claiming that “the gender concerns of pre-Enlightenment women may not always be secular or liberal in content, but they are nevertheless recognizably feminist or proto-feminist in spirit” (9). The truth of that claim will, of course, turn on how we are understanding ‘feminism’ and ‘proto-feminism’. What is less clear is that many of the women “recognized the implications of their theories for women as a social group” (ix). It is not obvious to me that Madeleine de Scudéry’s utopian, feminized world, guided by principles of sociability and affection, is meant to include peasant women. I have similar worries about Margaret Cavendish’s ability uniformly to conceive of duchesses and charwomen as members of a single social category, though a hint of this view appears sporadically in her writings. Moreover, in some of the women’s defenses of their fitness for education, e.g., Anna Maria van Schurman’s Whether a Maid may Be a Scholar: A Logick Exercise (1659), it is made clear that the arguments are limited to women of financial means who have the free time to devote to study.

But these are mere cavils in comparison to the sheer importance of what this history accomplishes: the mapping out of a tradition of women’s contributions to pre-Enlightenment European political thought, a tradition which has as a major focus sexual politics. Broad and Green characterize this tradition as an “autonomous tradition of women’s ideas” and claim that the history of this tradition “develops both alongside and in counterpoint to the history of men’s ideas” (291, 292). No doubt historians will discuss and debate these claims, and that we will learn a great deal by reflecting upon the whole new range of questions opened up by them. (For example, to what extent did pre-Enlightenment male philosophers focus on sexual politics? Does the history of women’s political thought require a distinct periodization from that of the men’s thought, e.g., when does the Enlightenment begin for women?) Relevant to the issue of the autonomy of the tradition of women’s political ideas is the question of whether the tradition of women’s thought from Christine de Pizan to Astell is continuous or extremely gappy. How much of a continuous tradition have Broad and Green been able to chart? As far as I can tell, there appear to be two non-intersecting lines of influence that lead to Astell. The first is very gappy: the history shows that Astell read Scudéry, who in turn refers to Marguerite de Navarre, and Broad and Green offer some evidence that suggests Marguerite may well have read Christine. The second line of influence leading to Astell is richer, but does not begin with Christine: Astell read Scudéry, who attempted to correspond with Anna Maria van Schurman, who in turn corresponded with Gournay and read Marinella, which latter read some of the earlier Italian women political thinkers.15 So far, however, there is no evidence that any of the Italians had read the works of Christine. I think it is too early to say that there is not enough evidence to justify the view that there is a genuine tradition of women’s pre-Enlightenment political thought. After all, as Broad and Green note:

We have offered only a preliminary study of this history, based on scholarship currently available. No doubt there are gaps that some scholars will lament… . We believe, at the very least, we have drawn a partial map of this vast and rich terrain, which we hope will facilitate and provoke further research (292).

This book is important as much for its historical breadth, meticulous attention to scholarly detail, and subtle interpretation of texts, as for the power of philosophical imagination fueling the ambitious, pioneering project. It is a groundbreaking work insofar as it has opened up a new way of approaching the history of European political philosophy — one that places gender politics and the voices of women center stage.

1 See for example, Introduction to World Philosophy, ed. Daniel Bonevac (Oxford: Oxford UP, 2004).

2 Modern editions of the texts of these and other women have been made available by the Cambridge UP series “Texts in the History of Philosophy” and “Texts in the History of Political Thought”, The U of Chicago Press series “The Other Voice in Early Modern Europe”, and Broadview Editions, among other sources. As Broad and Green note, access to the women’s texts has also been made possible by online collections and published anthologies.

3 If readers are wondering about the truth of this claim about women’s absence in histories of political thought, they need only peruse the tables of contents of books on this topic currently in print. Occasionally Mary Wollstonecraft is included, as the token woman, as in Tudor Jones, Modern Political Thinkers and Ideas: An Historical Introduction (2002). But see for example, Iain Hampsher-Monk, A History of Modern Political Thought: Major Political Thinkers from Hobbes to Marx (1992); Leo Strauss and Joseph Cropsey, History of Political Philosophy, 3rd Edition (1987); Alistair Edwards and Jules Townshend, Interpreting Modern Political Philosophy: From Machiavelli to Marx (2002); John Rawls, Lectures on the History of Political Philosophy (2007); and Classics of Political and Moral Philosophy, ed. Stephen Cahn (2002), in whose 1,200 pages the only contribution by a woman is a text by Martha Nussbaum, and, relegated to an appendix, an address by Elizabeth Cady Stanton.

Notable exceptions to this trend are volumes such as Social and Political Philosophy: Classical Western Texts in Feminist and Multicultural Perspectives, ed. James Sterba (1995), which includes texts by Marie de Gournay, Sarah Grimké, Mary Wollstonecraft, Harriet Taylor and Ayn Rand, as well as numerous contemporary women philosophers. But notice the need for the subtitle to alert readers that figures other than Aristotle, Hobbes, Locke, et al., will also be included.

4 See, for example, Quentin Skinner, The Foundations of Modern Political Thought, 2 vols. (1978); Janet Coleman, A History of Political Thought: From the Middle Ages to the Renaissance (2000) and A History of Political Thought: From Ancient Greece to Early Christianity (2000).

5 See Arlene Saxonhouse, Women in the History of Political Thought: Ancient Greece to Machiavelli (1985).

6 Christine treats these issues in, among other works, The Long Path of Learning (1402), Christine’s Vision (1405), The Book of the Three Virtues (1406), The Book of the Body Politic (1407) and The Book of Peace (1412-14).

7 Christine de Pizan, The Book of the City of Ladies, in The Selected Writings of Christine de Pizan, ed. Renate Blumenfeld-Kosinski and Kevin Brownlee (New York/London: W.W. Norton and Co., 1997), 132.

8 No doubt Christine is here drawing on Gen. 1: 27, “So God created man in his image, in the image of God he created him; male and female he created them”.

9 Broad and Green show how this premise about the greater nobility of the material cause of women’s bodies is used by Lucrezia Marinella in The Nobility and Excellence of Women, and the Defects and Vices of Men (1600), within a neoplatonic metaphysics in which the excellence of physical beauty must be accounted for by the excellence of the idea/form/soul that is its efficient cause and origin. Since women are physically more beautiful then men, their ideas/forms/souls are, then, more excellent than those of men. Further, since these ideas or souls form a chain that descends from God, by contemplating the idea of women’s more noble beauty, men may begin to raise their thoughts upward on this chain toward God.

10 This claim, which we have found in Christine and Gournay — that women as well as men are equally made in God’s image — is shown by Broad and Green to be used by Gabrielle Suchon to draw a more radical political conclusion in her Treatise on Morality and Politics (1693). By the end of the seventeenth century, Suchon understands being made in God’s image to imply being divinely invested with authority over worldly things. She concludes that women have been unjustly prevented from demonstrating their participation in God’s power through their exclusion from all forms of secular and ecclesiastical authority. What has prevented them has been “custom, the laws, and the absolute power of men” (263, quoting Suchon).

11 Of course, reason and perception are fine for dealing with the practical matters of everyday life. Judging that a rock is about to hit me, and stepping out of the way, does not undermine my sceptical stance. These are just the “appearances” that the ancient sceptics took to be insulated from scepticism about the true natures of things. Similarly, Gournay can say that a ruler should “serve Reason and practise Virtue” (131, quoting Gournay) for this is wise advice about practical matters: the appearances show that an irrational ruler is typically not conducive to human well-being. Nevertheless Gournay would not agree that her remark implies that reason can provide a justification of the law as moral truth.

12 For a sustained defense of this reading of Gournay, see my “Justifying the Inclusion of Women in Our Histories of Philosophy: The Case of Marie de Gournay”, in The Blackwell Guide to Feminist Philosophy, ed. Linda Alcoff and Eva Kittay (Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing, 2007).

13 Broad and Green do a great service in bringing to readers’ attention the importance of Scudéry’s social and political views. Among other things, they discuss her critique of a politics of power and ambition, and her conception of a utopian, feminine, social realm governed by principles of affection — a conception which in its time bore some resemblance to contemporary difference feminism but which, as they note, may well have influenced “Rousseau’s romantic conception of the place of love in society, and his representation of feminine difference” (189).

14 On this issue, see Hilda Smith, “The Radical Nature of Astell’s Christian Feminism”, in Feminist History of Philosophy: The Recovery and Evaluation of Women’s Contribution to Philosophy in the Western Tradition, ed. Eileen O’Neill and Marcy Lascano (Dordrecht: Springer, forthcoming).

15 The earlier Italian women thinkers include Isotta Nogarola (1418-1466), Cassandra Fedele (1465-1558) and Moderata Fonte (1555-1592).