A History of Women's Political Thought in Europe, 1700-1800

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Karen Green, A History of Women's Political Thought in Europe, 1700-1800, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 306pp, $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107085831.

Reviewed by Megan Gallagher, Brown University


This erudite and important volume by Karen Green continues the narrative she and Jacqueline Broad began in A History of Women's Political Thought in Europe, 1400-1700 (Cambridge University Press, 2009). The two volumes are of comparable length, but the focus on one century instead of three allows Green to maintain the geographic spread of the prior volume while dwelling more deeply on individual thinkers and the contexts out of which they emerged. The texts' overall aims are similar: to demonstrate that lack of attention to women's contributions to political thought is not the same thing as a lack of contributions. While women's efforts have often been submerged, scoffed at, or neglected, both in the early modern period and today, the works produced are worthy of our attention.

These claims remains necessary because, as Green points out, even sympathetic ears fail to translate that sympathy into written work.[1] Her central example here is the work of Jonathan Israel, to which she returns periodically throughout the text. Though Israel, in his well-known review "Enlightenment! Which Enlightenment?", criticized the editors of the Encyclopedia of the Enlightenment for not including Catharine Macaulay, he pays her no heed in his Democratic Enlightenment.[2] In her conclusion, Green observes that there has been no study of women authors' influence on their male compatriots (pp. 252), a provocation that readers will ideally take up.

This observation points to another aporia in both the primary and secondary literatures Green discusses: a number of the authors to whom she attends have not been translated into English or published in modern editions. Perhaps unintentionally, Green's volume speaks to the enduring importance of series like The Other Voice in Early Modern Europe. Though translations may not be favored over original texts by scholars, they are crucial for introducing a wider range of thinkers to both undergraduate and graduate students who do not have the requisite language skills to read the original. We think little of this in assigning René Descartes or Jean-Jacques Rousseau, or even a modernized edition of Thomas Hobbes' Leviathan -- all of which have been subject to multiple editors and translators. But the significance of the language barrier in broadening 'the canon' should not be underestimated. If we wish to build on Green's work, we need to address the lack of access and integrate women authors into lower-level courses in the history of political thought.

There is good reason to protest the current lack of accessibility. Green makes the case for several unique features that differentiate women political thinkers from their male contemporaries. One key attribute, that women have tended to write across multiple genres, eschewing the format of the treatise or essay typical of philosophical writing in favor of literature, is also a reason why women's writing has long been neglected. Green emphasizes the centrality of literature -- specifically, the novel -- to eighteenth-century women's written work.[3] Yet women also chose to express themselves via letters and memoirs (Lady Mary Wortley Montagu, Helen Maria Williams); drama (Aphra Behn, Margaret Cavendish); educational tracts (Catharine Macaulay, Sarah Trimmer); religious writings (Mary Astell, Hannah More); and novels (Eliza Haywood, Madeleine de Scudéry).[4] Yet for every reason given over the centuries for women's exclusion -- women were not formally educated to participate in philosophical discourse, they did not write "philosophy" proper -- one can think of male exceptions to the rule. Rousseau was famously self-taught. The fact that male contemporaries often wrote in multiple genres (consider Hobbes's translation of Thucydides's History of the Peloponnesian War; Montesquieu's novel, Les Lettres persanes; and Rousseau's opera, Le devin du village) did not exclude them from engaging in philosophical discourse, as it did for women.

Perhaps a firmer distinction between women and male writers of the period is that women wrote with a different audience in mind. Per Green, "the women studied here were not writing for an academic audience, but for an engaged public, of which they were a part" (5). In part, "engaged public" refers to the salons which women directed during the eighteenth century. Salons have garnered significant academic attention in recent years but Green astutely points out that the published works of women involved in them have not been the focus, so much as the social capital in which the salonnières trafficked.[5] (Though such a detour would understandably take Green too far afield, it would nonetheless be intriguing to learn more about precisely how women cultivated their audiences outside of salons.) As the salons expanded the range of places in which philosophical thought could be cultivated and shared to include the realm of the domestic and feminine, the so-called "woman question" gained increasing attention. That is, what is women's nature and what, if any, political place ought they to have? Perhaps most importantly, what are the consequences for women's inclusion in the public sphere?

These questions operate in the background of both Broad and Green 2014 and Green 2015. In her review of the former for the NDPR, Eileen O'Neill asked, "does the history of women's political thought require a distinct periodization from that of the men's thought, e.g., when does the Enlightenment begin for women?" Green offers a tentative response to this question with her division of women thinkers into ancients and moderns. The ancients are characterized by their critique of luxury and their fondness for "austere" republicanism.

Green characterizes Catharine Trotter Cockburn, Catharine Macaulay, and Mary Wollstonecraft, among others, as ancients. Moderns tend to laud progress, measured by men's receptivity to women's participation and increased opportunities for women's education. Green counts Madeleine de Scudéry, Emilie du Châtelet, Catherine the Great, and Olympe de Gouges among their ranks.

Green argues this ancients/moderns distinction responds to the tendency to label individuals as moderates or radicals -- that "it has appeared more natural to read women's texts, particularly those from the first half of the century, through the division that arose between those who favoured the attitudes of the ancients and those who identified as moderns" (11). By refining our analytic categories, these categories have the potential to more carefully attend to how our thinkers understood themselves and to avoid imposing post-hoc labels on their ideological positions. Instead it would embrace the language of the seventeenth century's querelle des anciens et des modernes and map our authors onto a terrain they would find familiar. Yet the distinction is unfortunately not carried through the text -- the last index entry for 'ancients and moderns' for example, is page 137 -- out of 258 pages of text. Indeed, chapter 8 explicitly reverts to the moderates/radicals dichotomy with the title "Radical English Women."

The failure to follow through with the ancients/moderns distinction raises another question. Though the narrative arc is roughly chronological, individual chapters rely on national, or regional, groupings: "Enlightenment women in Italy," "From Hanover and Leipzig to Russia," "Women and revolution in Italy, Germany, and Holland," and so on. Yet in recent decades, scholars have fervently debated the degree to which "the Enlightenment" should be understood as a national, or even a singular, phenomenon.[6] Though Green touches on the ways in which women thinkers mobilized in defense of national identities and ideals (39-42, 105, 232), it remains a fruitful area of research. In particular, it would be interesting to know why she chose to adhere to the national framework rather than a transnational 'republic of letters' not bound by territorial markers.

Indeed, we might ask what, precisely, Green's argument is. Her overall claim is that the history of ideas looks quite different when considered from women's perspective (1, 254). To those inclined to agree, this seems more self-evident truth than argument. Green's title alerts us to the perils of her project, and others similar to it: A History of Women's Political Thought in Europe, 1700-1800. The inclusion of 'women's' is simultaneously necessary, in so far as it specifies and delimits the project, and indicative of the extent to which men and men's thoughts remain the default. Yet feminist scholars have long recognized the inadequacies of the 'additive model,' in which women are simply assumed to have the same interests as men, 'added on' like so many supposedly unsexed bodies.[7] But is there enough linking women, by virtue of their sex, that such comparison is analytically fruitful? Is there not a risk of reducing women to their sex while trying to argue for their importance as individual thinkers?

Green acknowledges this quandary, noting that "Women's political attitudes and arguments are as diverse as those of men. Is there enough in the 'joint interest of their sex' to justify devoting a work to the political thought of European women during the Enlightenment, to the exclusion of men?" Her project, of course, requires she answer in the affirmative: "This volume is predicated on the assumption that there is. For, despite the differences among them, there are commonalities in women's political situation, and the trajectory of the history of political thought looks rather different when examined through women's works" (1). This latter claim -- that "the trajectory of the history of political thought looks rather different when examined through women's works" -- is peculiar, in so far as it links women's thought, in all its diversity, by virtue of what it is not: male, or of masculine authorship. I note this not because I see an easy solution to this seemingly perennial problem. Perhaps it is sufficient to observe that writing a history of women in philosophy is distinct from writing a history of feminist thought.

To those disinclined to agree that the inclusion of women's voices significantly alters the history of ideas as currently understood, evidence must be sought in Green's discussions of individual thinkers, which are invariably insightful. One particularly strong entry is her analysis of Macaulay's influence on Wollstonecraft in chapter 8. Bridget and Christopher Hill argued, with great influence, that Macaulay, as an "aristocratic republican," was more of the former than the latter.[8] The effect of this was to make Wollstonecraft seem far more sui generis than she was. In situating Macaulay not alongside James Harrington but rather in dialogue with Edmund Burke and Thomas Paine, Green demonstrates that Macaulay "maintained an unswerving commitment to universal democratic principles" (189). Such reinterpretations can only be advanced if careful attention is paid to women authors' debts to other women.

A minor objection may be made about the experience of reading the text, which is hampered by its function as a survey. There is a wealth of information contained in its pages, but it does begin to feel like a litany of names and dates. This raises the question of audience -- who would profit from reading it? Likely, any scholar interested in eighteenth-century thought or the history of philosophy by women would benefit. Those who work in the dominant Anglophone and Francophone literatures will certainly benefit from increased familiarity with the range of thinkers Green discusses. Her attention to writers and thinkers from Italy, Prussia (called Germany here, oddly), Russia, and Holland, even if given less consideration than British and French authors, is welcome and most impressive. Yet for many, it will not be a book one wants to sit down with and dig into for an afternoon, pencil in hand -- it may function better as a resource, read chapter or section at a time.

All the same, this book, particularly when paired with Green and Broad's earlier one, is an invaluable contribution to areas of scholarship where scholars have been reluctant to take seriously the contributions of women. It is ideal for undergraduate and graduate students seeking an introduction to the period or the figures discussed. (It would also, paradoxically, be of use to students who have no intention of focusing on the thinkers treated within, and instead are seeking merely a familiarity.) Green has produced a necessary, invigorating account of value to anyone seeking to expand -- or dismantle -- the canon of political thought.

[1] An anecdote may demonstrate why such claims, defended with the careful research found in Green's volume, remain necessary. My copy of Broad and Green was subject to a performative failure of the most grievous and hilarious kind: the word "women's" is missing from the title on the front cover (though not the spine or back cover). At the time of writing, this erasure is still visible on Amazon.

[2] Jonathan Israel, "Enlightenment! Which Enlightenment?" Journal of the History of Ideas 67.3 (2006): 523-545; Alan Charles Kors, editor in chief, Encyclopedia of the Enlightenment, 4 volumes (Oxford University Press, 2003); and Israel, Democratic Enlightenment: Philosophy, Revolution, and Human Rights 1750-1790 (Oxford University Press, 2013). Macaulay merits two mentions in Israel's A Revolution of the Mind: Radical Enlightenment and the Intellectual Origins of Modern Democracy (Princeton University Press, 2009), but neither involves sustained attention to her thought. Wollstonecraft graces the cover of his Democratic Enlightenment: Philosophy, Revolution, and Human Rights, 1750-1790 (Oxford University Press, 2011), but is mentioned a mere handful of times.

[3] This claim is not unique to Green -- indeed, it builds on a rich tradition of scholarship, particularly by scholars of English literature. The interested reader might consult Ros Ballaster, Seductive Forms: Women's Amatory Fiction from 1684 to 1740 (Oxford University Press, 1992); Josephine Donovan, Women and the Rise of the Novel, 1405-1726 (Palgrave Macmillan, 2013 [2000]); Catherine Gallagher, Nobody's Story: The Vanishing Acts of Women Writers in the Marketplace, 1670-1820 (University of California Press, 1995); and Patricia Meyer Spacks, Novel Beginnings: Experiments in Eighteenth-Century English Fiction (Yale University Press, 2005).

[4] It should go without saying that the authors listed in this paragraph, though sometimes best known for their work in a particular genre, were not limited to just one.

[5] On salons and the 'republic of letters,' see Dena Goodman, The Republic of Letters: A Cultural History of the French Enlightenment (Cornell University Press, 1994), and Steven Kale, French Salons: High Society and Political Sociability from the Old Regime to the Revolution of 1848 (Johns Hopkins University Press, 2004).

[6] See Dan Edelstein's The Enlightenment: A Genealogy (University of Chicago Press, 2010); Anthony Grafton, "A Sketch Map of a Lost Continent: The Republic of Letters," Republics of Letters: A Journal for the Study of Knowledge, Politics, and the Arts 1.1 (2009); and John Robertson's The Case for the Enlightenment (Cambridge University Press, 2005).

[7] For critiques of the additive model, see Kimberlé Crenshaw, "Demarginalizing the Intersection of Race and Sex: A Black Feminist Critique of Antidiscrimination Doctrine, Feminist Theory and Antiracist Politics," The University of Chicago Legal Forum (1989): 139-167; Patricia Hill Collins, Black Feminist Thought: Knowledge, Consciousness and the Politics of Empowerment (Harper Collins, 1990); and Elizabeth V. Spelman, Inessential Woman: Problems of Exclusion in Feminist Thought (Beacon, 1988).

[8] See Bridget Hill and Christopher Hill, "Catharine Macaulay and the Seventeenth Century," The Welsh History Review 3 (1967), 381-402, and Bridget Hill, The Republican Virago: The Life and Times of Catharine Macaulay, Historian (Clarendon Press, 1992), as well as Bridget Hill, "The Links between Mary Wollstonecraft and Catharine Macaulay: New Evidence," Women's History Review 4 (1995), 177-192.