A House Divided: Comparing Analytic and Continental Philosophy

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Prado, C. G. (ed.), A House Divided: Comparing Analytic and Continental Philosophy, Humanity Books, 2003, 329pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 1591021057

Reviewed by Samuel Wheeler, University of Connecticut


This collection of eleven essays, subtitled “comparing analytic and continental philosophy,” is a mixture of good essays and essays that are so irritating that their merits may be masked. The best essays discuss particular pairs of thinkers in a knowledgeable, fair, and interesting way. Some other essays are a reminder that the contempt that many analytic philosophers bear to continental philosophy is returned.

The essays that discuss “analytic” and “continental” in general terms by and large strongly favor “continental.” They also regard analytic philosophy as having ended sometime well before 1970. Much is made of analytic philosophy’s disdain for metaphysics, for instance. Kripke appears in the index just twice, once as a Wittgenstein scholar and once mentioned in passing by Rorty. The remarkable turn to pre-critical, pre-Kantian metaphysical speculation that now flourishes among “analytic” philosophers is not mentioned.

A difficulty with some of the “general” essays is that “analytic philosophy” is a loose term without identifiable doctrines, given that Brandom, Kripke, Kaplan, Chisholm, Davidson, Carnap, Austin, Hempel, and Wittgenstein fall under its extension. Such a vague family resemblance target is difficult to attack on the basis of particular traits. So some of our authors declare various theses to be part of the “analytic tradition” without much argument or, as far as I can see, warrant.

Since the essays are quite diverse, I will discuss them in the order of their appearance:

1) Richard Rorty’s contribution, “Analytic and Conversational Philosophy,” continues Rorty’s characterization of philosophy as a contingent cultural practice rather than an enquiry at the core of humanity’s telos. Not surprisingly, he regards the division into “analytic” and “continental” philosophy as largely institutional. Graduate students need to prepare themselves for the job market, crossing lines by reading material that will not further this end reduces the probability of getting a job. Thus most members of the profession never read analytic or “continental” texts until after tenure, if ever.

The division Rorty sees is between the dominant “analytic” conception of philosophy as a kind of conceptual handmaiden to science, “getting things right,” and the dominant “continental” conception of philosophy as cultural critique. The first is what Rorty sees as the main conception analytic philosophers hold of philosophy; the second is how continental philosophers view the subject. Rorty proposes the terms “analytic” and “conversational” philosophy, which sorts individuals slightly differently.

Rorty has a pessimistic view about the present and future of analytic philosophy. “Getting something right” presupposes something that is constant and stable. Crudely and briefly, his argument is this: If concepts, as Quine, Davidson, and Wittgenstein have argued, change with change of cultures, then there is no permanent “getting things right” in conceptual analysis. So, arcane discussions of the subtleties of conditionals or causality, for instance, are not working out the details of the infrastructure of science but are rather descriptions of very minor parts of the current contingent practices. Rorty therefore doubts that there are “natural explananda,”(p.23) i.e. philosophical problems, that are dealt with at various times by Plato and Dretske or by Aristotle and van Inwagen.

This is a puzzling argument, given Rorty’s general agreement with Davidson. If we can understand Plato, then, even though no ancient Greek term has quite the place in Plato’s thought that any modern English term has in ours, we can “think the same thing” as Plato thought, in the same way that we can say what Galileo said. For a Davidsonian, to suppose that common problems, formulated in sentences that “say the same thing,” require some strict identity of “things thought” is a mistake that presupposes exactly what Rorty is attacking, namely timeless propositions. Communication does not require trans-linguistic meanings. Rorty’s idea that, for instance, Plato is complaining about some entirely different problem in Athenian politics than modern Americans are complaining about in American politics seems to over-state differences. Where the line would be between the arcane peculiarities of a single culture’s concepts at a time and the topics about which we can communicate might be obscure. But “philosophical problems” do seem to transcend particular cultural locations.

Rorty’s remarks about the tenure-driven institutional state of “analytic philosophy” are well taken. Given the accuracy of Rorty’s general conception of “philosophy” as a literary practice, the narrowing that is taking place as literatures grow and young philosophers perforce read only within their narrow specialty, the intertextuality required for there to be a single field vanishes.

2) Barry Allen’s essay, “Carnap’s Contexts: Comte, Carnap and Heidegger” is wide-ranging. It begins by arguing that Carnap, as a logical positivist, should be understood “in the context” of Comte, a positivist tout court. It then launches into a discussion of Carnap versus Heidegger, heavily favoring Heidegger. Then there is a discussion of Carnap versus Nietzsche, again heavily favoring Nietzsche by assigning various derogatory Nietzschean epithets to Carnap (and to other “positivists”.)

The essay is a mix of interesting and insightful discussions, nasty digs at Carnap et al, and mystifying remarks. For instance, in discussing the role of logic in early analytic philosophy, Allen says that the logician’s distinction between “is” as identity, as existential quantification and as predication “…does not exist apart from the demand for a translation into the new logic.” Some remarks on why it is irrelevant that paradoxes (Socrates is red, red is a color, Socrates is a color) vanish on the new theory of truth-conditions are in order.

Carnap is placed in the tradition of philosophers who have denounced “philosophy.” Allen does not mention that this tradition goes back to Descartes, at least. In effect, Allen argues that Heidegger and Nietzsche offer deeper and more penetrating critiques of philosophy than the pale “positivism” that Quine, himself a positivist, deconstructs. “Positivism,” the focus of much of the essay, becomes such a broad term that (p.53) “Plato may have been the first positivist…” “Positivism” seems to refer to an urge for systematicity and “order” in accounts of what is. One wonders whether Husserl and Aquinas are positivists, according to Allen.

The overall impression of this essay is that it is revenge for Carnap’s admittedly ill-advised and mistaken critique of Heidegger. But attacking Carnap for character-flaws (assuming Nietzsche’s valuations) is puzzling in the context of a defense of Heidegger. A writer with less spleen could recognize that Carnap’s clueless polemics are no more relevant to Carnap’s work than silly Futurist manifestos are relevant to the value and interest of Futurist paintings.

3) Babette Babich’s “On the Analytic-Continental Divide in Philosophy/ Nietzsche’s Lying Truth, Heidegger’s Speaking Language, and Philosophy,” consists largely of assertions about analytic philosophy and citations of other people’s assertions. A reader somewhat familiar with both traditions will be puzzled as to why some of these assertions are taken to be true. One is surprised to find, among the claims of the “Twenty-two paragraphs against analysis” that “For analytic philosophy, all of metaphysics together with the traditional problems of philosophy, is, as an accomplished and desired deed…, already at an end and by definition (as meaningless and unverifiable.)” This is accompanied by a footnote saying that it is not true of all analytic philosophers, but that analytic metaphysics “is not robust.”

Near the end of the essay, Babich directs attention to the expected claim that “analytic philosophy is not like that any more.” In a baffling paragraph, Nagel’s “What It Is Like to Be a Bat” and Lewis’ “Attitudes De Dicto and De Se” are discussed or ignored. The discussion of the Lewis article ends with the observation that, “…for analysts, propositions are technical devices, having, as sentences do not always have, logical objects.”

This section is followed by a discussion of the “annexation” of continental philosophy by analytic philosophers, which consists in analytical philosophers getting interested in people like, for instance, Nietzsche. Their annexation, according to Babich, gets Nietzsche wrong, because of their analytic background. (It turns out that even many continental philosophers read Nietzsche in the wrong way.) The puzzling aspect of this complaint is the thesis that there is a single way of getting Nietzsche right. If philosophy is an intertextual literary practice, then one would expect that those with different backgrounds of texts would have different “readings” of a given text or group of texts. Wrong readings would presumably be readings that were unilluminating or uninteresting. But a claim that the analytic annexers are getting Nietzsche wrong would need to have more support than just the claim that the author’s take on Nietzsche is right, since other takes on Nietzsche may well also be right. There are many things that are true of Nietzsche, and some of those things may be illuminated by reading him in the light of analytic background texts. Presumably, Nietzsche’s intentions did not involve the relation to the hundred and some years of texts that intervened on either the “analytic” or “continental” side.

4) David Cerbone’s “Phenomenology: Straight and Hetero” is a comparison of Husserl and Dennett on the deliverances of consciousness. It proceeds by sketching Dennett’s third person approach to introspection, and frames the Husserlian reply by discussing Husserl’s replies to contemporary skeptics of introspection.

The exposition of Dennett’s views and Dennett’s reasons for suspicion of the “first-person” point of view about introspection is admirable and accurate. The next section asks what Dennett’s target has to do with Husserl. The answer is, “very little.” Husserl’s phenomenology is not introspection as conceived by Dennett or by Husserl’s contemporary critics. Cerbone’s exposition of Husserl is careful and clear. Essentially, Husserl has a very different project from the project Dennett criticizes.

Whether or not Dennett took himself to be giving a serious critique of Husserl, which seems unlikely, Cerbone’s essay may prevent some analytic philosophers from dismissing Husserl.

5) Clough and Kaplan’s “Davidson and Wittgenstein on Knowledge, Communication, and Social Justice” is a puzzling essay. The project is to explain how the insights of Wittgenstein and Davidson can resolve the following difficulty for feminist social-justice theorists: They wish to say that all knowledge-claims are relative to a culture while speaking from within an oppressive culture and criticizing that culture by invoking objectively true normative knowledge claims. Davidson’s and Wittgenstein’s “non-foundationalism”s are to give the answer. Although “foundationalism” is not characterized in detail, I take it that it is the thesis that knowledge begins with unconceptualized data that are processed in determinate ways to yield propositions that are known. Relativism would then be the thesis that there are alternative processings.

On this understanding, Davidson is clearly an antifoundationalist. On Davidson’s view, neither relativism nor “realism” are coherent views, since both presuppose a given that can be divided up either arbitrarily or according to its intrinsic nature. But a Davidsonian antifoundationalism is prima facie independent of claims that knowledge is tainted by power relations or socially constructed. While I can imagine an interesting argument from Davidsonian theses that would arrive at some conclusions agreeable to feminism, I am not a subtle enough reader to see them in this text.

In Wittgenstein’s case, the discussion largely concerns his Remarks on Frazer’s The Golden Bough. To be sure, the explanations Frazer gives are partial at best. But between the “noble savage” interpretation of Wittgenstein and the benighted experimentalist interpretation of Frazer there seems little to choose. Wittgenstein seems to hold that the drummers are not trying to make it rain, while Frazer treats them as quite dense. It is puzzling that the application of this discussion apparently appeals to true human nature. Clough and Kaplan say, “Wittgenstein is here asking us to acknowledge, and indeed embrace, parts of ourselves that our current form of life denigrates.” Alternative forms of life are “by their nature, far more impressive… than reasons could be.” A bit of explanation of how this comports with feminism and the historical are in order.

After a discussion of the feminist difficulties with maintaining relativism in the face of science’s pragmatic success, Clough and Kaplan conclude that Davidson and Wittgenstein can solve the feminist problem above. Their conclusion, although they seem not to want to say it, is that the “feminist dilemma” they started with is a pseudo-problem from the perspective of Wittgenstein and Davidson.

6) Richard Matthews’ “Heidegger and Quine on the (Ir)relevance of Logic for Philosophy” discusses some nice parallels between Quine’s take on logic and Heidegger’s. Neither takes logic to be absolutely special, for instance. Quine treats logical truths as very high-level generalizations; Heidegger treats logic as useful for mere science.

Some of the other parallels Matthews draws are less convincing. Quine’s “background theory” or “background language” arguably has a different role from Heidegger’s background, being the metalanguage in which the object language is described, and itself admitting of being an object language for another metalanguage. However, at a deeper level, there is a correspondence between Quine’s idea that any thought is language-like and Heidegger’s idea that beliefs and positings presuppose other positings, not all of which can be made explicit at once. So Quine’s idea that giving what we really mean is just regress to a background language does have something to do with Heidegger’s anti-Husserlian position on the possibility of making our thoughts explicit.

7) C.G. Prado’s “Correspondence, Construction and Realism, The Case of Searle and Foucault” is a discussion of correspondence versus “constructivist” conceptions of truth, arguing that Foucault’s conception of truth is closer to Davidson’s and Sellars’ than Searle’s is. This is a very daunting task, since even interpreting Searle’s, Davidson’s, and Foucault’s views in anything like the same metric is challenging.

Prado’s method is an exposition of Searle’s realism and an attempt to explain Foucault’s views of power and what Prado distinguishes as five distinct uses of “truth.” I’m not sure how much a reader not already familiar with Foucault would gather from any short exposition of Foucault’s notion of power. Prado agrees with criticisms of some of Foucault’s uses of “truth,” but argues that Foucault’s purified view is one that can be usefully compared with those of Searle and Davidson.

The argument is then, very roughly, that important features of Foucault’s conception of truth correspond to Davidson’s self-described “Coherence Theory of Truth.” Roughly, truth is a matter of internal relations among beliefs, not a matter of fitting the world. The difficulty with the argument is that Davidson, while not retracting any theses in the essay, regretted the title, “A Coherence Theory of Truth”, as encouraging exactly the kind of misunderstanding of his view that Prado endorses. Truth for Davidson is a primitive notion that cannot be defined in other terms (see his Journal of Philosophy articles). Davidson is neither a coherence theorist nor a correspondence theorist. Of course only a belief can be evidence for another belief, but it does not follow that truth is a systematization of what we believe.

So is Davidson akin to Foucault in some respects or not? Prado’s discussion, as so many discussions of the nature of truth, takes place at a level of abstraction that makes it difficult to know what one thinks about the issues. Perhaps a better way to proceed would have been to focus on particular discussions by Foucault. A question such as “Was Callicles homosexual” would bring out the sense in which, for Davidson, there are no conceptual schemes, but there are conceptual differences that raise problems about truth-values.

I think that, at some deep level, Prado is right that Foucault and Davidson are useful mutual supplements. It would be a complex but great project to supplement Davidson’s austere account of interpretation with the marvelous and persuasive discussions Foucault has given or to add a Davidsonian structure to Foucault’s insights into the cultural conditions of thought.

8) Ramberg’s “Illuminating Language: Interpretation and Understanding in Gadamer and Davidson” is a subtle and perceptive discussion of the extent to which Davidson and Gadamer can be usefully compared. Very briefly, Gadamer phenomenological and “ontological” questions turn out to have little immediately to do with Davidson’s account of how agents in a world constitute themselves as agents by triangulation. Both accounts of interpretation are at a distance from actual interpretative practice, but distanced in different respects. Davidson constructs a theoretical account of how language, thought, and intentionality could arise from organisms in an environment, while Gadamer constructs an account of how limited, historically conditioned humans can get anything close to right.

I think Ramberg over-states the extent to which Davidson’s account is distanced from actual interpretations. Davidson’s account is abstract, but illuminates in the way that game theory illuminates. We can see the structures Davidson formalizes in social interactions. In relation to Gadamer, though, it is clear that Davidson is on a different page. What exactly would Davidson make of Gadamer’s conception of truth? How does it interfere with a person knowing that there have been dogs that that person is finite and historically situated? Gadamer’s “truth” is Truth, approached via human experience and language.

Ramberg suggests that there is some hope for achieving a philosophical perspective from which the work of Gadamer and Davidson can be both taken into account. I’m not sure what this perspective would be. Here is a simple-minded conjecture: A Davidsonian feels a bit of unease about a sentence like “Water is an element,” or “Callicles was homosexual.” Are they true or false? Philosophers of science, on the one hand, and Foucault, on the other, make such questions problematic. The very terms presuppose a background that we don’t share. We want to say that the whole conception, the theory and practices involved in these words, is dubious. But the sentences ought to be either true or false. Perhaps Truth can enter a Davidsonian’s thinking along with truth by focusing on cases where historicity and finiteness makes “`Fred is a frog’ is true if and only if Fred is a frog” somehow inadequate.

Ramberg’s essay is well worth Xeroxing.

9) Mike Sandbothe’s “Davidson and Rorty on Truth: Reshaping Analytic Philosophy for a Transcontinental Conversation” is a perceptive and detailed “narrative” of the long interchange between Davidson and Rorty on the role, if any, of truth in philosophy and semantics. The narrative itself is a useful map for anyone trying to keep track of the concessions and eventual remaining disagreements of this discussion.

The “narrative” does much more than that. It yields an enlightening meta-philosophical discussion of analytic and continental philosophy and provides a nice contrast with the combat stance of some of the other essays in this volume

Sandbothe’s purpose is to illustrate two different conceptions of what philosophy should be. Rorty’s view, that philosophy should be therapy, getting people not to take even therapeutic systematic philosophical projects seriously, is part of an analytic tradition that includes the later Wittgenstein and sometimes Austin. The other analytic tradition (Quine, Carnap) therapizes by systematic formalism. Davidson, for instance, takes seriously the idea that a formalization of what a theory of truth is, via a Tarski-style truth-definition, explains something, an idea Rorty eschews. Davidson of course practices both forms, doing non-formalizing therapeutic work on topics such as realism and anti-realism and well as applying systematic techniques to semantics. Sandbothe points out that both of these conceptions can be found not only in analytic philosophy but also in continental philosophy. So Sandbothe’s contrast is between therapy via formalization and system and therapy that discards system.

In this light, Carnap, Quine, and Wittgenstein are all therapists, with different techniques. On the continental side, Nietzsche goes with Wittgenstein and Husserl goes with Quine and Carnap. Such an analysis brings out the great change that has taken place in “analytic” philosophy in the last forty years or so, the return to systematic philosophy as solving problems about the world. In a way, from this perspective, Carnap and Husserl have more in common than Carnap and Lewis.

10) Barry Stocker’s “Time, Synthesis, and the End of Metaphysics: Heidegger and Strawson on Kant” investigates the differences between Heidegger and Strawson via their books on Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason. Both books have the mission of extracting what is valuable from what is of merely historical interest in Kant, thereby interpreting Kant as a precursor of their enlightened views. Since Kant is the last historical figure in the canon of both analytics and continentals, this turns out to be pretty interesting, both in the contrasts and in the similarities in what is taken to be important about Kant. The essay also presupposes that the reader already has a fairly detailed knowledge of the First Critique and the differences between the first and second editions.

Stocker treats the difference as illustrating the difference between analysis and critique. In brief summary, Strawson treats Kant as a theorist about the conditions of possible conceptual schemes, while Heidegger treats him as beginning to address the question of the ontological difference. So, again briefly, Strawson treats the First Critique as really about knowledge while Heidegger, preferring the first edition to the second, treats it as a treatise on the metaphysics of metaphysics.

As a consequence, Heidegger and Strawson have very different treatments of the preconceptual, which Strawson regards as incoherent and Heidegger regards as a glimmer of the question of Being. I could not follow the final part of the paper, suggesting that Heidegger is better able than Strawson to accommodate “showing” rather than “saying.”

This is, as one would expect, a very dense article that calls on the reader to look back at passages in Kant, and to be at home with the Heideggerian take on metaphysics and conceptual schemes.

11) Edward Witherspoon’s “Much Ado about Nothing: Carnap and Heidegger on Logic and Metaphysics” begins by showing that Carnap’s famous critique interprets Heidegger unfairly. Most of the rest of the essay discusses Heidegger’s conception of logic, and the sense in which Heidegger “rejects” logic. Heidegger thinks of Logic (capital “L”) as the constitutive “rules of thought,” that without which there could not be thought. Lower case “logic” is a theory of Logic. Heidegger’s thought, roughly, is that metaphysics is prior to logic, in that an understanding of Logic is required to have an adequate theory of logic.

Heidegger’s understanding of logic, one has to say, ignores the very substantial developments that assimilated logic to mathematics. One has to wonder at the level of current knowledge of a thinker who claims in the 1920’s that logic has not made progress since the Stoics. One wonders what Heidegger thinks of mathematics.

Carnap’s logical syntax of language, however, is not a very good foil. To claim that it is part of syntax to ask which arguments go with which predicates misses an important part of the idea of formal logic and syntax. One could also question, on Quinean grounds, the idea that logic is importantly “prior” to other kinds of knowledge.

Witherspoon argues that the Heideggerian conception of metaphysics as insight into Being, to be appreciated only if one has it, is akin to religious faith, which can only be seen to be reasonable if one has it. This take on Heidegger does not bode well for reuniting this section of the House with the analytic wing.