A Hundred Years of English Philosophy

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Milkov, Nikolay, A Hundred Years of English Philosophy, Kluwer, 2003, 302pp, $138.00 (hbk), ISBN 1402014325.

Reviewed by Christopher Pincock, Purdue University


The goal of this study “is to articulate a flawless, comprehensive description of the philosophical texts of the seven most significant philosophers in England in the twentieth century” (ix). It is made up of a short introduction followed by one chapter each on G. E. Moore, Bertrand Russell, Ludwig Wittgenstein, Gilbert Ryle, J. L. Austin, P. F. Strawson and Michael Dummett, and concludes with a bibliography and an extensive index that together take up 56 pages. As the inclusion of Wittgenstein demonstrates, the scope of the book is not limited to philosophers born in England, but only to those practicing in England. In line with this aim, philosophy outside of England proper is usually ignored, as is, in fact, philosophy outside of Cambridge and Oxford.

Milkov adopts these priorities in explicit opposition to the more traditional narrative-based histories of analytic philosophy such as Dummett’s Origins of Analytical Philosophy and Hacker’s Wittgenstein’s Place in Twentieth-Century Analytic Philosophy (1). Unlike these studies, which explicitly adopt a particular perspective or figure in organizing their discussion, Milkov presents his book as a neutral basis upon which other historians can build. Judged by this standard, I must report that this book is not a success. Its main virtue may be to stand as a cautionary example of how not to write a history of analytic philosophy.

Milkov offers a review of the writings of these seven philosophers in chronological order. His account begins with Moore and Russell’s break with the idealism that they encountered in the 1890s at Cambridge. Here Russell emphasized the needs of mathematics and science, while Moore focused on ethics in addition to offering a more general account of judgment. Milkov draws attention to these different priorities and how they contributed to the different ways that Moore’s and Russell’s philosophy developed over time. The third Cambridge figure discussed is Wittgenstein, who studied with Russell at Cambridge from 1911-1913, and then returned to lecture at Cambridge in 1929. Milkov tries to find one unified account of Wittgenstein’s thinking that will link the Tractatus to the later Philosophical Investigations. The discussion of philosophy at Oxford begins with chapters on Ryle and Austin, the foremost figures of the ordinary language movement in philosophy that reached its peak influence in the 1950s. Reacting both to traditional philosophy and to what was perceived as the overly metaphysical and technical philosophy of Russell, Ryle and Austin directed their attention on ordinary concepts and practices. Later, Strawson and Dummett, the two other Oxford philosophers treated, developed their own philosophical programs in response to the excesses of Ryle and Austin. Strawson, for his part, articulated a new ’descriptive’ approach to metaphysics, while Dummett defended a more ambitious philosophy of language that promised to help resolve questions in metaphysics and the philosophy of mathematics.

This much of the history of analytic philosophy is well known. A history need not deviate from this increasingly standard picture to be of value, but it seems that it should do at least one of two things to command our attention. Either it should introduce and clearly explain these views to the novice or it should offer the specialist new insights into why analytic philosophy developed in the way it did. Milkov’s lack of interest in doing either of these things becomes clear in the first chapter on Moore. In 33 pages Milkov offers brief summaries of nearly all of Moore’s books and papers, interspersed with frequent asides and footnotes recording interpretative judgments or connections with other philosophers. Given the mandate to review so much philosophical work in so few pages, Milkov is forced to limit himself to stating Moore’s conclusions with little or no explanation or account of his arguments. Thus, in section 4, on Moore’s Principia Ethica, Milkov notes Moore’s charge that Mill and Sidgwick were guilty of various “conceptual confusions” (25), but fails to explain how Moore might convince anyone of the truth of this charge. More frustrating are Milkov’s summary judgments on the proposals that Moore offers. Principia Ethica is described as an “extreme form of moral idealism … developed under the influence of McTaggart” (27). Without explaining what moral idealism is, or why he sees it in Principia Ethica, Milkov will leave most readers either confused or upset. Beginning readers will not understand what Moore’s views actually were or why he held them, while more advanced readers will know that this proposed interpretation flatly contradicts the interpretative consensus that Principia Ethica offers an unrepentant moral realism.

These flaws run throughout the remaining six chapters, and reach egregious proportions in the chapters on Russell, Wittgenstein, Strawson and Dummett. It must be said that Milkov’s chapters on Ryle and Austin are more successful, although this is most likely due to the fact that these two authors published comparatively little. This makes the discussions of 31 pages each more thorough and nuanced, and these chapters offer readers a useful overview of Ryle’s and Austin’s philosophical developments. Even here, though, things go wrong at times. For example, Milkov claims that Austin’s rejection of meanings as entities “was a form of what later was called anti-realism: the wish to demonstrate that there is no such a [sic] thing as reality” (155), surely a strange view to attribute to a defender of ordinary language. And it is hard to know what to make of Milkov’s statement, in a footnote, that Austin’s “’nomenclature’ of speech acts … in fact follows Russell’s belief that the description of the logical forms is a ’question of nomenclature’“ (174) in the 1918 “Philosophy of Logical Atomism” lectures.

I hope it is now clear why I do not believe that Milkov has met his stated goals of providing a neutral overview of the work of these seven philosophers. He obviously has a broader set of interpretative commitments regarding the arguments and positions presented, but instead of carefully setting them out and defending them in the context of the arguments we find in these historical texts, he offers only brief asides. Encountered in this context, they remain unclear and unconvincing.

Rather than review all of the various problematic passages, I will restrict my discussion to my most serious reservations about his discussion of Russell. Milkov opens his chapter with the surprising claim that “Russell was never an idealist,” supported only by the remark “His criticism of psychology had already been manifested in his ’Review of Heymans’ (1895)” (47). This appears to assume that idealism is tied to psychology, or perhaps psychologism, and ignores the anti-psychologism of British idealism. More importantly, there is no explanation of Russell’s Foundations of Geometry, which was dedicated to McTaggart, or Russell’s many autobiographical remarks discussing his idealism in the 1890s.

A second confusing remark is Milkov’s claim that “The Theory of Descriptions has also an epistemological aspect: Russell’s Multiple Relation Theory of Judgement” (62). Recall that the theory of descriptions was first presented in “On Denoting” (1905) and proposed that sentences of the form “The F is G” should be interpreted as saying that there is exactly one F and that it is G. Prima facie, this has no direct connection to a philosophical account of judgment. When Russell presented the theory of descriptions he still maintained a dual relation theory of judgment, according to which judgment is a relation between a judging subject and a proposition. It was only later in 1907 that Russell sought an account of judgment that would not assume propositions as basic entities. On this later view, judgment is a multiple or many place relation between the subject and the constituents of the proposition judged. While the theory of descriptions helps fix what these constituents are, it leaves open the question of the ultimate status of the propositions themselves.1 Milkov’s “epistemological aspect” claim is thus not plausible.

Finally, Milkov misstates the nature of Russell’s logical constructions of ordinary objects and matter: “After his first discussions with Wittgenstein, Russell came to believe that material objects are inferred entities, constructed out of sense-data. That is, the objects of physics are logical constructions out of sense-data” (80). First of all, no evidence is presented to support the suggestion here that Wittgenstein influenced or even endorsed Russell’s logical construction project. More importantly, Milkov confuses inferring the existence of an entity, like a table, and constructing an entity out of sense data using the logical resources of Principia Mathematica. In Problems of Philosophy (1912) material objects are inferred as the causes of our sense data and so not are constructed at all. Logical constructions assume center stage only after Russell adopts his “supreme maxim in scientific philosophizing”: “Wherever possible, logical constructions are to be substituted for inferred entities.”2 Once this maxim is adopted, Russell tries to construct a table as the series of sense data or “aspects” that it presents to all observers, both actual and hypothetical. Despite the central role of these constructions from 1914’s Our Knowledge of the External World through 1948’s Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits, Milkov devotes only a page to summarizing their character.

These failings suggest some lessons that Milkov’s book might teach us about the history of analytic philosophy. First, they should remind us how difficult it is to get history right. Simply reading and summarizing the works of famous philosophers is not enough, even when our summaries turn out to be accurate. Genuine historical understanding requires the reconstruction of the arguments that a philosopher offers, and not just her conclusions. Reconstructing even the main arguments of one philosopher is a tricky business, and to attempt to present the views of seven philosophers in 250 pages is not realistic.

Second, the failures of Milkov’s “comprehensive” approach make it clearer why a narrative approach to the history of analytic philosophy is essential. It does not necessarily result in bias or distortion, as Milkov seems to fear. As long as the goals and perspectives of the historian are clearly articulated, a selective history is in fact much better than a history that aims for comprehensive description. Selectivity at least offers a reasonable hope that the resulting interpretive proposals can be well defended and that the views of the philosophers under review can be fairly discussed.

Third, I think Milkov’s book should remind us how important it is to discuss philosophers in conjunction with their broader philosophical context, especially when that context is otherwise foreign to us. British idealism was a peculiar approach to philosophy, arguing for the twin conclusions of monism and the quasi-mental character of their one substance, the Absolute. It is only when we understand why people would think these sorts of things that we can appreciate and understand Moore’s and Russell’s rejection of idealism. This is what makes works like Hylton’s Russell, Idealism, and the Emergence of Analytic Philosophy so useful. Hylton explains the features of British idealism that appealed to Russell and shows how he was able to overcome certain presuppositions that stood in the way of a realist metaphysics.

In closing, I must draw the reader’s attention to Milkov’s two volume work from 1997, The Varieties of Understanding: English Philosophy since 1898. While it is noted in the bibliography of A Hundred Years of English Philosophy, Milkov nowhere acknowledges the near complete overlap in material covered, organization, terminology and conclusions between the two books. At 835 pages, Varieties fills out in a much more detailed manner the elliptical proposals of . Hundred Years, and it is to this book that we must turn if we are to see Milkov’s conception of the history of analytic philosophy worked out in sufficient detail.


Dummett, Michael. 1993. Origins of Analytical Philosophy. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

Hacker, P. M. S. 1996. Wittgenstein’s Place in Twentieth-Century Analytic Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell.

Hylton, Peter. 1990. Russell, Idealism, and the Emergence of Analytic Philosophy. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Landini, Gregory. 1991. “A New Interpretation of Russell’s Multiple-Relation Theory of Judgment”, History and Philosophy of Logic 12: 37-69.

Milkov, Nikolay. 1997. The Varieties of Understanding: English Philosophy since 1898. 2 Volumes. Frankfurt am Main: Peter Lang.

Russell, Bertrand. 1914. “The Relation of Sense-Data to Physics”, reprinted in J. Slater (ed.), The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, Volume 8, London: Allen & Unwin, 1986.


1. Landini 1991 offers a nuanced argument for a connection between the theory of descriptions and the multiple relation theory, but Milkov does not cite this paper or any of Landini’s work.

2. Russell 1914, p. 11, my emphasis.