A Metaphysics for Scientific Realism: Knowing the Unobservable

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Anjan Chakravartty, A Metaphysics for Scientific Realism: Knowing the Unobservable, Cambridge, 2007, 251pp., $92.99 (hbk), 9780521876490.

Reviewed by James Ladyman, University of Bristol


Anjan Chakravartty argues for a form of scientific realism that has substantive metaphysical components. He does not regard metaphysics as an additional feature to be developed independently of the defence of realism itself. Rather he defends his form of metaphysically rich scientific realism as a solution to the problems that scientific realism in general faces. Hence this book is not just about metaphysics but also epistemology. Indeed, since Chakravartty has interesting and important things to say about the nature of scientific representation and the reference of theoretical terms, his work is about the semantics of science too. In what follows I will explain where Chakravartty is situated in contemporary debates about scientific realism, outline the main features of his position, and then briefly present some difficulties for his view.

Chakravartty discusses three positions that the standard account of scientific realism includes: a commitment to a literal understanding of theoretical discourse purporting to refer to unobservables; the claim that the sentences of theoretical science, when understood literally, are truth-apt and have mind-independent truth-conditions; and finally, the claim that knowledge is expressed by such sentences. Chakravartty states that his aim is to describe the foundations of scientific realism rather than to engage in a detailed defence of it and in a critique of its rivals, e.g., Bas van Fraassen's constructive empiricism. He does, however, discuss van Fraassen's presentation of the dispute between realists and empiricists, according to which realism involves a commitment to engaging in metaphysics and explanation by posit. Chakravartty seems to accept van Fraassen's idea that disputes between philosophical movements ought to be understood in terms of what he calls 'stances' rather than doctrinally. However, Chakravartty argues against van Fraassen that the empirical stance cannot be the source of any persuasive argument against metaphysics.

It is important to note that Chakravartty agrees here with one of van Fraassen's central charges against scientific realism, namely that it must be a metaphysical position, not only in the sense that it involves beliefs about and explanations in terms of unobservable objects, but also in the sense that it commits us to what is often called analytic ontology. Yet many realists would hope to be able to defend epistemic access to unobservables postulated by science without being committed to a project of theorizing about universals, tropes and individuation. Although Chakravartty forcefully rebuts the charge by van Fraassen that speculative metaphysics invites a regress of explanations, he also agrees with van Fraassen that the project of fully articulating scientific realism must involve the metaphysics of objective modality and theories of causation, essence and so on. Where van Fraassen sought to undermine scientific realism by associating it with metaphysics, Chakravartty argues that an adequate defence of the former requires the resources of the latter. This is worthy of further attention. While I agree with Chakravartty and have argued myself that explanations in terms of unobservables are not worthy of the name unless they cause the phenomena in a thick sense that goes beyond mere constant conjunction, there are many philosophers who think of themselves as Humean scientific realists.

It is striking that in van Fraassen's The Scientific Image the pessimistic meta-induction (PMI) does not figure in the critique of scientific realism or the defence of constructive empiricism. By contrast, in the contemporary debate in general, and in particular for Chakravartty, the PMI argument is regarded as the true threat to realism, not the argument from the underdetermination of theory by data. This is one of the most significant aspects of the evolution of the subject, since for most of the twentieth century the problem of underdetermination was a central concern. (Theory change did, however, figure prominently in the thinking of Pierre Duhem and Henri Poincaré.)

The demise of underdetermination is matched by the rise of explanation in the epistemology of science. It is still widely accepted that empirical virtues of scientific theories (scope, strength, and adequacy in relation to observed phenomena) trump all others. However, it is widely accepted that there are many theories that will agree in respect of all these virtues but disagree with respect to super-empirical theoretical virtues such as simplicity, elegance, and explanatory power, or with respect to what they predict about what has not yet been observed. Sceptics about scientific realism must confront two facts: First, in scientific practice super-empirical virtues are often taken as reasons for theory choice. Second, the underdetermination argument can be put in the form of the problem of induction. This means that some fancy epistemological footwork is needed if any positive epistemology is to be part of antirealism, since the empirical adequacy of theories is something that is just as underdetermined as their full theoretical truth.

Inference to the best explanation is regarded by many (following the late great Peter Lipton among others) as the way to deal with both the problem of induction and the problem of underdermination simultaneously. The idea is that inference in both cases must be understood as proceeding via theories that are intricately linked with the rest of our causal beliefs about the world. The pursuit of unity in our structure of beliefs has been so conducive to the advancement of theoretical knowledge that it is simply unreasonable to deny that the world has a comprehensible causal structure, which has been to a large extent successfully catalogued by science. Hence both the sceptic about induction and the instrumentalist about the theoretical part of science can be charged with wilfully dropping the kind of inferential thought practices they ordinarily use and endorse; in doing so, they are playing an epistemological parlor game rather than raising a genuine problem. The most pressing issue then becomes whether or not the commitment to causal structure requires the world to have an objective modal structure, or whether it is compatible with some kind of Humean mosaic.

Inference to the best explanation was already dominant in the defence of scientific realism when van Fraassen argued for a pragmatic approach to explanatory power. Chakravartty does not take van Fraassen head on but borrows a trick from him by setting out not to show that scientific realism is rationally required, nor that constructive empiricism is incoherent or irrational, but simply that realism is an "internally consistent and coherent stance" (p. 91). This dialectical difference between Chakravartty and realists whose primary target is empiricism is explained in part by the dialectical difference between PMI and underdetermination. The latter threatens our justification for a realist commitment to a theory by presenting us with the possibility that the evidence be as it is and our theory false. The former has as its conclusion that scientific realism, understood as a potentially explanatory naturalistic hypothesis, stands refuted by the empirical evidence that allegedly inductively supports the idea that our best current theories will turn out to be false. Hence, if Chakravartty is successful both in holding off the empiricist critique of van Fraassen (albeit without being able to refute the latter's position), and in defending a form of scientific realism that is immune to the PMI, then that would be quite an achievement. Note that the underdetermination argument, when it is presented in the form in which it tends to be in contemporary philosophy, is a priori by comparison with PMI. This is ironic, since it was an empirical fact -- the revolution in the relationship between physics and geometry in the early twentieth century -- that motivated underdetermination for many of the previous generation of philosophers of science.

Chakravartty is committed to anti-Humeanism about natural necessity in general, although he thinks that scientific realism may be defensible with less of a commitment to objective modality than he himself makes. He is also committed to realism about causal powers, a theory of natural kinds and property clusters, and a certain prioritization of particulars and of singular causation. In this last respect, his position is close to that of Nancy Cartwright, Ian Hacking and other members of the Stanford school, who give prominence to entity realism over theory realism and emphasize inference to the most probable cause over inference to the best explanation. (Indeed realism about causal powers was a prominent theme in Cartwright's Nature's Capacities and their Measurement.)

Chakravartty uses Cartwright's distinction between idealization and abstraction to develop his account of scientific representation. Yet where Cartwright uses ceteris paribus laws as part of her case that physics and other sciences represent the world truly only in their concrete and messy applications to experiment and other real cases rather than via their abstract and general theoretical laws, Chakravartty argues that ceteris paribus laws describe dispositions, hence the key role of the latter in the metaphysics of science. However, Chakravartty does not conclude that the most highly theoretical laws do not represent the world. Hence he combines entity realism and realism about singular causation with a commitment to the approximate truth of the theoretical science and realism about the laws of nature understood as expressing the properties and relations of and among kinds.

The pessimistic meta-induction is one of many arguments that have to do with concrete facts about the history of science rather than a priori epistemological reasoning. In its most stark form it says that our best science is probably false because that is how we now view the best science from the past. The essence of Chakravartty's reply to this, following philosophers of science such as Ron Giere and Philip Kitcher, is that there are sufficient respects in which, for example, electromagnetic radiation is like a propagating disturbance in the ether, for us to be confident that our theories will be regarded as at least approximately true by future science. However, unlike Kitcher, Chakravartty denies that we can regard utterances of "dephlogisticated air" by Priestley as referring to oxygen because the causal powers of the oxygen and dephlogisticated air do not coincide. Thus on his view many of our utterances involving theoretical terms will be regarded as not referring to the world by future science in which the terms they deploy have not been retained. The trick of course is to say something informative about which bits of contemporary science one should expect to be like waves in the ether and which to go the way of crystalline spheres. Chakravartty's semi-realism, which he first articulated in print more than a decade ago, is one of various strategies that respond to theory change by finding criteria for some kind of selective epistemic commitment. According to semi-realism, the causal dispositional properties of various natural and artificial kinds that science identifies are stable under theory change; hence scientific realism needs metaphysics to articulate the details of dispositions, causes and powers.

Chakravartty has an interesting take on natural kinds and essences. While he believes that there are both, he is also sensitive to the problem that many kinds that we use in successful inductions are not natural ones. He introduces the idea of the sociability of properties. Clearly some properties come together in a way that seems universal and not accidental. However, this is not enough to give us natural kinds with essential properties. Chakravartty advocates essentialism about properties, but not about natural kinds in general since he thinks some of them lack essences and are instead "cluster kinds". He then argues that projectable associations between properties that do not involve natural kinds are ultimately explicable in terms of the distribution of the natural properties of the world. This gives natural properties the status of a fundamental level of reality, if one believes in such a thing, in terms of which explanations can be given of all other phenomena.

My main problems with Chakravartty's position are as follows. The presentation of underdetermination does not do justice to genuine phenomena of underdetermination and inductive inference one finds in science or the solutions for dealing with it found, for example, in theories of confirmation, probability and statistics. The relationship between geometry and physics, or the underdetermination in interpretations of quantum mechanics, ought to be more the objects of study than the utterly simplified examples of theoretical underdetermination often dealt with in the literature (although laudably not by Chakravartty). (This said, Chakravartty has his own reasons for leaving underdetermination in general to one side.) The metaphysics of powers and dispositions faces the charge that in relation to the PMI it amounts to an empty manoeuvre because the response to, for example, revolutions in optics, is that we will always be committed to light having a dispositional property to give rise to phenomena of diffraction, interference, and refraction. Is this really to be committed to more than the empirical adequacy of our optical theories, repackaged with the explanation that the phenomena in question are the result of dispositions being manifested by stimuli? Chakravartty says that explanations must end somewhere and asserts that the realist and the empiricist draw a different line as to where this is, the latter giving special status to the distinction between the observable and the unobservable (p. 180). However, empiricists like van Fraassen deny this. All explanations are of merely pragmatic status, even those concerning the observable realm, for it is no less devoid of objective modality than the world described by theoretical science. Chakravartty does not discuss the thesis of Humean supervenience, nor reduction, nor the relationship between the special sciences and physics, but I think that the metaphysics of scientific realism must come to grips with these issues.

When it comes to the problem of verisimilitude, if we follow Chakravartty's advice and "seek the truth in Newton's theory of gravity", part of what we find is the disposition of bodies to be subjected to a force that is proportional to the inverse of the square of the distance between them (p.69). In the end I am not convinced that an appeal to the metaphysics of essences, powers, and dispositions is of any help with this problem. The disposition cited is certainly retained by contemporary physics, but we should insist that it now be rendered not in terms of force but of geodesic motion in a spacetime of variable curvature. The ontological commitments of contemporary physics are surely very different from those of Newton, and the common disposition of the world that both would identify in the behaviour of apple-like projectiles hardly settles the matter of whether we ought to believe in the reality of the spatio-temporal manifold given that the theoretical ontology has changed in the past. (Chakravartty agrees with this, but holds that while the "auxiliary" properties of Newtonian physics are not retained in subsequent science, a sufficient proportion of the properties of forces are.) In any case, I do not think that Chakravartty's position is completely empty, for the affirmation of an objective causal structure is surely to be marked as a genuine difference from both empiricist modal nihilism and from Humean scientific realism. Whether he is right that modal realism is a concommitment of scientific realism, he has produced an interesting and coherent form of scientific realism that organizes and defends views that I think many philosophers hold.

Chakravartty is clear and engaging in his writing, and charitable and judicious in his arguments with other philosophers. His book is essential reading for those interested in scientific realism or the metaphysics of science.