A Metaphysics for the Mob: The Philosophy of George Berkeley

Placeholder book cover

John Russell Roberts, A Metaphysics for the Mob: The Philosophy of George Berkeley, Oxford University Press, 2007, 172pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195313932.

Reviewed by Marc A. Hight, University of Tartu/Hampden-Sydney College


As a part of a resurgence in interest in Berkeley, scholars have increasingly sought new interpretations of the Irish philosopher designed to improve his image and make his unusual immaterialist metaphysics more philosophically respectable. Such is the case with John Roberts, who argues in his monograph for a new understanding of spirit (mind) that he believes renders Berkeley's overall philosophy more potent as well as more consistent with the common sense views of ordinary people. Although this review will highlight concerns and philosophical engagements, none of them should overshadow the fact that the book is quite good and an excellent addition to the secondary literature on Berkeley.

In the introduction Roberts writes that "the ultimate aim of this work is to make plain that the roots of Berkeley's metaphysics are ancient and that the ground from which it grows is common to us all" (xv). In order to uncover the common ground, Roberts asserts that he needs to provide a coherent account of Berkeleian spirits. The task of providing such a coherent account is sufficient justification for the project in itself, and thus some may find the title of the book somewhat misleading, since most of the effort and argument in the monograph properly concerns spirits. That and other analyses lead to the discussion of common sense in the final chapter, but most of the controversial and interesting work will have already been completed by the time the reader reaches that discussion. The book is an interesting and occasionally provocative read, although not always a convincing one. Although it is not hard to read, the order of exposition sometimes makes the reader work more than necessary. There are also a few odd gaps in the scholarship that are worrisome. In the main, however, the book is of high quality and Roberts' arguments will rightly provoke engagement in the secondary literature.

The main thesis is that past scholarship has misread the nature of Berkeleian spiritual substance. Berkeley identifies volition, activity, action, and act. Thus, when he says that a spirit is a substance, he means that a spirit is an individual unity whose essence is activity, which just is volition. Instead of saying that minds are substances that will, Roberts contends that for Berkeley minds as substances are wills. "As with the term 'soul,' the term 'will' does not denote something one has. One is a will" (93). Roberts does provide evidence for his view and his analysis is intriguing, but it is one thing to state a view and quite another to establish its coherence. How Roberts builds his case over the course of the book is intelligent but not perfectly satisfying.

The first chapter argues that Berkeley is a monist: only spirits are proper substances. A main point of the chapter is to defeat rival views that characterize Berkeleian minds as bundles while reinforcing the position that minds are simple substances. As is common with philosophical texts, there are many healthy quibbles one might raise, but two are not so minor and are worth mentioning here.

First, Roberts explicitly mentions the rival 'bundle' accounts of Robert Muelhmann and Steve Daniel, but oddly gives the latter an uncharitably short dismissal. A quick look in the bibliography reveals that he cites only one article by Daniel, which is unfortunate since Daniel has built his Berkeley career on a now lengthening series of articles pushing an account of mind that in some respects has a lot in common with Roberts' own view.[1] Roberts dismisses Daniel's claim because the latter violates "Constraint 1" (7): where there is conflict in the texts one should give preference to published views. I happen to support the idea behind the constraint, but the issue is whether Daniel violates it at all. On Daniel's view, the Notebooks are not actually inconsistent with the published works, and Roberts does not engage any of that analysis. I am not defending Daniel's reading (in fact Roberts even cites an article in which Walter Ott and I attack it), but given its relevance to the theme of the book, a more detailed consideration would have been welcome.

Second, in the chapter Roberts seeks to ground an understanding of Berkeley's theory of dependence in terms of the more fundamental categories of activity and passivity. He claims that dependence for Berkeley is divided into two kinds that are "woven into a single line of thought" (24). It is not exactly clear after analysis how the two 'kinds' of dependence are importantly different, but the underlying thesis is well motivated and crisply defended. Roberts rightly notes Berkeley's emphasis on the activity of substances as opposed to the passivity of other things, including ideas. Ideas of sense are 'passively' dependent on the mind in the sense that we are not causally responsible for perceiving them. Another activity (God) directs them to us. Ideas of the imagination, however, are actively dependent on us because we generate them.[2]The core of his position has merit, but there are unresolved questions about the ontology that supports his metaphysical distinction. In a book about spirit in the thought of a philosopher who says that there can be no volitions without ideas, it is a surprising omission not to discuss anything about the ontological nature of ideas (other than the trivial fact that they are dependent beings). If ideas are dependent on minds in virtue of how they are generated, then it seems reasonable to ask what it is (i.e. what kind of thing) that is dependent. The question is even more pressing since Roberts claims that spirits are the only fundamental posits in Berkeley's ontology. What is it that is dependent (sometimes actively and sometimes not) on the mind? Are ideas modifications or something else? If Roberts' interpretation of Berkeley's ontology is going to be coherent then these questions need to be explicitly addressed.

In the second chapter Roberts provides a single account of Berkeley's anti-abstractionism that deflects possible objections to his own reading. The chapter is solidly argued with interesting discussions, but for want of space I press on to more important matters.

The third chapter sees Roberts outlining his view of the nature of spirits. According to his reading of Berkeley, our link to reality (qua minds) is "attitudinal." The interpretation is a clever application of contemporary philosophy, but it is not clear that the entire effort comes together. He starts by claiming that for Berkeley all activity is volitional (75). Thus, in particular, motion is not an action. At this point one would expect at least a reference to Tom Stoneham's interesting analysis of agency in the sixth chapter of his monograph Berkeley's World (which appeared in 2002), an important work in the field of Berkeley studies. Yet the work is not even listed in the bibliography. Obviously one cannot read and engage everything, but the omission is troubling. Independently, the analysis is nonetheless quite smart.

Smart does not mean universally persuasive, however. As a part of his argument, Roberts rightly notes that each of us discerns the presence of other spirits by the signs of sign-use (that is, by noting that some of the ideas I perceive were not generated by me, yet appear to have been generated by a being like me -- another spirit). The core insight is well noted and intriguing: the recognition of other minds is tied to language use. Roberts uses Daniel Dennett's concept of an 'intentional stance' to clarify his own new interpretation of what Berkeley means. He develops a concept he calls the 'personal stance.' When we see ideas of a certain sort and order we adopt a particular attitude towards those ideas, namely the attitude of treating them as if they were signs of another mind. We can set aside concerns about anachronism and whether it is reasonable to suppose that Berkeley could have adopted such a contemporary viewpoint, since the final position that emerges is unlikely to be one Berkeley would have endorsed.

On Roberts' account, a finite mind cannot know that it is dealing with a mind and not a natural automaton. For him, believing that there are other spirits depends on "the pragmatic value of the predictive success that adopting the stance provides" (81). Yet that means that adopting a stance is actually independent of whether another mind really is there. We could, God forbid, be wasting our time trying to save the 'souls' of mere natural machines! Roberts seems unaware of the potential consequence of his analysis. Consider page 85, where he writes "It is an essential part of the process of becoming a person that we be able to respond appropriately to other persons." But according to his own analysis, that is not quite right. What is essential is that we respond as if there were persons, regardless of whether there actually are persons present. Stances do not require actual people, thus Roberts appears to be conflating 'taking a stance' with 'becoming a person.' And that result is anti-Berkeleian. Berkeley thinks he has a theory that enables us to induce that other minds exist, not one that enables us to act as if other minds might exist.

To make matters worse, Roberts' ultimate position undercuts a position dearly held by Berkeley. Using the analysis of the personal stance, Roberts argues that faith is the foundational attitude on which all knowledge is based (86). So to know that other spirits exist, we need faith that God will keep his covenants to maintain the regular connections between ideas in nature. Yet in the Principles (sections 146-7), Berkeley provides an argument from the regularity of what we perceive and the presence of pleasure and pain to the existence of God. When talking about the then forthcoming Principles in a 1709/10 letter to Percival (1 March), Berkeley says the book is designed "to demonstrate the existence and attributes of God …" To read Berkeley as saying that we need faith in God for us to have knowledge is to make his system circular and deprives Berkeley of his famous argument for the existence of God. None of these claims deny that the application of the personal stance is a smart bit of philosophy, but Roberts is aiming at explicating Berkeley.

Chapters four and five are perhaps the most important in the book. Here Roberts defends his central claim about the nature of spirits: the essence (and identity) of spirit is activity. "On Berkeley's view, a spirit's very being is volition" (94). As a result, he argues that "I am identical to my will" (94). These chapters are an exciting read, but it is hard to make proper sense of the final theory.

For a start, despite his assertions on page 94 for his identity claim and his heavy reliance on the Notebooks, Roberts apparently ignoresPhilosophical Commentaries (PC) 849, where Berkeley writes (without the '+' marginalia) "The Spirit, the Mind, is neither a Volition nor an Idea." At a minimum he needs to explain the entry in light of his conviction that minds are to be identified with activity or volition. Furthermore, the final position is not clear. It is difficult to know how to understand his claim that "I am my will." To what does the word 'my' refer? If, as we have already seen, it is wrong to say that the mind wills, because the mind is will, then one is left with no sense of how to make the theory work. How do we individuate minds? There is no satisfying discussion of how Berkeley individuates minds anywhere in the book.

Berkeley most often writes as if minds are beings that are essentially active, breaking the identity of mind and activity. For just one example, consider Principles 27: "A spirit is one … being: as it perceives ideas, it is called the understanding, and as it produces or otherwise operates about them, it is called the will." Berkeley writes as if there is a being that wills, and in those cases we call it the will. One might plausibly argue against Roberts that such cases are evidence that Berkeley denies the direct identification. More tellingly, if we invoke his own "Constraint 1," since the passages that support his identification thesis (of the spirit and will, especially PC 712) apparently come exclusively from the unpublished Notebooks, should we not favor the published passages that appear to indicate otherwise?

What is disappointing is that there are ready rival readings that Roberts does not engage at all. There are at least two worth mentioning. First is the traditional Cartesian understanding of the mind. Spirits are substances that will. One can maintain that Berkeley adopts a new theory of the essence of mental substances (as Roberts does) without thereby being committed to the claim that minds are wills. Roberts does not charitably consider this alternative rival Cartesian view (he does claim to be defending another version of it, however), especially in light of the considerable literature on the subject. Second, we could adopt a position like the one Roberts refused to engage earlier, namely Daniel's view that minds are ordered collections of willings. Roberts would, I take it, reject that view because he wants to distance himself from any kind of bundle view of the mind (even bundles of activities or willings). On Daniel's view, the mind is the principle of unity or organization of volitions. Thus Daniel is also in a position to explain PC 849: the mind is not a volition, but a higher principle that organizes volitions into a unity.

To deepen the difficulty in understanding the coherence of Roberts' reading, he argues that spirits are "essentially evaluative beings" (96). To say that what minds do qua active things is evaluative seems an interesting and reasonable hypothesis. The problem, however, is that Roberts just stops there. If, as he says, reality is divided normatively (into things that are responsible and things that are not), then one might nonetheless accuse Roberts of failing to complete the ontology. 'Accountable' and 'Not accountable' do not appear to be foundationalontological categories, despite his assertions to the contrary. One can ask what is accountable. For minds, that appears to be some kind of unified spiritual substance. In that case, perhaps the fundamental category is substance and not accountability per se. And of ideas (the 'Not accountable' portion of the world) nothing is said at all. The discussion in the fifth chapter about occasionalism -- which I should note is otherwise quite well done -- promises to shed light on these issues, but in fact never does. Without a discussion of the individuation of minds or the ontic nature of ideas, the final picture is intriguing, but incomplete.

This review cannot draw to a close without a discussion of the final chapter, where Roberts applies his theory of spirits to argue that Berkeley can be read as one who genuinely preserves common sense. He thus concludes that Berkeley's immaterialism provides "a metaphysics for the mob." Relying again on some contemporary philosophy and the language of nature hypothesis to guide his analysis, Roberts adapts Sellars' concept of the manifest image to argue that Berkeley held what he calls the 'religious image.' With the manifest image we personify everything in the world. Under the religious image, ordinary folk take persons to be the fundamental category of being, but under the stricture of a divine presence. Thus, especially in the context of the 18th century, Roberts suggests that Berkeley was promoting a metaphysics that really did appeal to a commonly held understanding of the world. Everything is fundamentally a spirit.

Here again, the suggestion is intriguing, but only partly convincing. If we recall Roberts' own position, spirit is identical to activity (volition). Did people, even in the 18th century, think of the world as being constituted fundamentally by only act? Most audiences will be skeptical. Even were we to accept the religious image, it is still not transparent how this makes Berkeley a philosopher of the mob.

The probing tone of this analysis should not obscure the fact that the reading Roberts gives for spirits is packed with interesting and innovative moves. He does read and engage texts that are often neglected. His attempt to implicitly integrate the Siris into the rest of Berkeley's main metaphysical works might be met with skepticism by some, but the attempt is worthwhile. This review has focused on some troubling points precisely because the issues are important and Roberts' analysis provokes good philosophical discussion. One may not agree with everything in this book, but the reader will learn from it and thus I recommend it to any serious Berkeley scholar.

[1] For a few of the articles that develop Daniel's view that are old enough to have been considered, see: "The Ramist Context of Berkeley's Philosophy," British Journal of the History of Philosophy 9 (2001), 487-505; "Berkeley's Pantheistic Discourse," International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 49 (2001), 179-94; "Berkeley's Christian Neoplatonism, Archetypes, and Divine Ideas," Journal of the History of Philosophy 39 (2001), 239-58; "Edwards, Berkeley, and Ramist Logic," Idealistic Studies 31 (2001), 55-72; "Berkeley, Suárez, and the Esse-Existere Distinction," American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 74 (2000), 621-36. Daniels has since gone on to further refine the view. Note that I am not endorsing Daniel's view.

[2] The distinction has been noted before, in particular by me, but the emphasis Roberts gives to the distinction is particularly well done. See Marc Hight, "Defending Berkeley's Divine Ideas," Philosophia 33 (1-4) 2005: 97-128.