A Middle Way: A Non-Fundamental Approach to Many-Body Physics

Middle Way

Robert W. Batterman, A Middle Way: A Non-Fundamental Approach to Many-Body Physics, Oxford University Press, 2021, 174 pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197568613.

Reviewed by Julia R.S. Bursten, University of Kentucky


A Middle Way introduces the philosophical community to a species of reasoning in the physical sciences known as “hydrodynamic methods.” Hydrodynamic methods emphasize the role of mesoscale mathematical parameters and mesoscale material behavior in the construction of explanations of diverse individual physical phenomena, as well as patterns of universal behavior across physical systems. As a species of scientific reasoning, hydrodynamic methods contrast with “bottom-up” methods for constructing models of physical systems by modeling the behavior of the smallest units in a system. Robert Batterman rightly points out that hydrodynamic methods have been largely overlooked by philosophers up to this point. He diagnoses this oversight as the product of philosophers’ overemphasis on grounding their analysis in fundamental physical theories, and he argues that this oversight has led to two interrelated philosophical myopias. First, it has led philosophers of physics to misunderstand the stakes of the inter-theory relations debate, particularly by equating that debate with questions of reduction and emergence. Second, it has funneled metaphysicians toward ontologies grounded in fundamental physical theory, and such ontologies mistakenly equate the most so-called fundamental categories with the most natural categories.

Batterman develops a view in which hydrodynamic methods serve as a methodological guide to philosophical analysis as well as evidence for certain epistemic and ontological conclusions. This approach contains a refreshing alternative to reductionist approaches to inter-theory relations in physics, as well as presenting novel and, Batterman argues, more apt source material for scientifically informed metaphysics. These arguments generally succeed and unquestionably provoke new thought about what the proper aims and methods should be for the 21st century’s philosophy of physics. A Middle Way is thus a must-read for those whose research engages with contemporary philosophy of physics. Prospective audiences should be prepared, however, as Batterman writes for the active, persevering reader: the mathematical and physical content is clearly written but by no means entry-level, and the details of the dialectical landscape in which the philosophical discussions are located are sometimes left to the reader’s imagination.

Batterman advances his hydrodynamic approach to philosophy of physics over the course of the book principally through a series of careful case studies in many-body physics, an area of physics that is itself underrepresented within the philosophy of physics literature, and which is rarely besought as a source of metaphysical content (though cf. Needham 2017). After introducing the book’s central projects in the first chapter, Batterman offers in the second chapter a brisk review of his well-known critique of the reduction–emergence debate. This iconoclastic critique, most fully developed in Batterman’s previous monograph (Batterman 2002), urges philosophers to recast the reduction-–emergence debate in terms of the autonomy of less fundamental theories from more fundamental ones, and to thereby aim philosophical analysis toward an answer to the question, “[H]ow can systems that are heterogeneous at some (typically) micro-scale exhibit the same pattern of behavior at the macro-scale?” (Batterman 2021, 31).

A Middle Way’s central cases begin in Chapter 3, “Hydrodynamics,” which introduces readers to the mathematical techniques emblematic of hydrodynamic methods in physics. As this chapter is crucial to the argument that follows, as well as being exemplary of Batterman’s style, it is discussed in some detail next, followed by more summary remarks about the rest of the book.

Hydrodynamic methods, developed by Leo Kadanoff and Paul Martin during the middle of the 20thth century, are a distinctive variety of multiscale mathematical models of many-body physical systems. Some additional background: Across the sciences, multiscale models are taken to be mathematical or conceptual models of systems that exhibit multiple types of characteristic behavior at different length, time, or energy scales. As the use of such models has become increasingly prevalent in the sciences over the last half-century, philosophers of science have become increasingly motivated to articulate how these models support the accurate description of physical (or biological, or economic, etc.) behavior and the reliable acquisition of knowledge from scientific modeling. A Middle Way is first and foremost a landmark entry into this burgeoning philosophical conversation.

In multiscale modeling, scales are distinguished from each other relationally, such that the length scale that counts as the “macro” or largest scale for one system can be the “micro” or smallest scale for another system. Importantly, many multiscale models consist of three (or more) sets of characteristic dynamics at distinct scales: a macro, a micro, and a “meso,” or middle, intermediate scale. This is the “middle” after which A Middle Way is named. The hallmark of hydrodynamic methods, and what distinguishes them from other varieties of multiscale models in physics, is the way they characterize physical activity at the mesoscale.

As Batterman explains it, hydrodynamic methods mathematically model the dynamical evolution of mesoscale conserved quantities in many-body physical systems that are near, but not at, equilibrium. This modeling occurs via systems of partial differential equations (PDEs). These systems of PDEs consist of conservation equations, which model the mesoscale dynamics of conserved quantities, coupled with constitutive equations, which assist in defining the systems to which the model applies—or, in Batterman’s own words, which “specify the nature of the [modeled] system” (ibid, 55). Just how this specification occurs, and how it enables mesoscale dynamical descriptions of the system, is the subject of a masterful seminar in the mathematics of hydrodynamic methods that occupies much of the chapter. 

Importantly, Batterman highlights, hydrodynamic methods produce a description of a near-equilibrium system’s dynamics in terms of fluctuations of mesoscale conserved quantities. These fluctuations persist much longer than the random collisions of the microscale particles in the system, and their decays toward equilibrium can also be characterized by correlation functions. Correlation functions are a distinct mathematical model developed from equilibrium statistical mechanics. Batterman discusses how the ability to model fluctuations with the mathematical techniques used to model correlation functions enables one to draw, via some advantageous mathematical technicalities, a further correspondence between such systems’ microscopic and macroscopic behaviors. 

These technicalities are the devils in this chapter’s details, and mastering them enables one to understand how in hydrodynamic systems, dynamical differences at the micro-scale fail to disrupt universal patterns of behavior at the macro-scale. Thus, in laying out the mode of scientific reasoning that is the subject of the monograph, the chapter also demonstrates Batterman’s characteristic mode of philosophical reasoning, in which the mathematical and physical details are not just evidence for epistemic and ontological conclusions, but are methodologically integral to the philosophical argument.

With this foundation laid, Batterman next considers Einstein’s work modeling Brownian motion before generalizing to make observations about the role of hydrodynamic methods in solving transport problems across the physical sciences. The discussion of Brownian motion illustrates how the hydrodynamic approach can accommodate multiscale modeling that involves multiple temporal scales, as well as multiple spatial scales. More importantly, though, these discussions connect the hydrodynamic approach with the methodology of upscaling from mesoscale representative volume elements to macroscale continuum parameters, which is a preoccupation of an earlier chapter and of much of Batterman’s earlier research. In these discussions, correlation functions again play the crucial role, and Batterman additionally gestures at philosophical morals concerning the conceptual interdependence of theories.

In the final three chapters, Batterman develops a few philosophical payoffs of the hydrodynamic approach. Among these, the most novel contribution is the ontological one: Batterman argues that the fluctuating quantities represented by mesoscale parameters are a more “natural” foundation for a physically-informed metaphysics than categories derived from the microscale. This conclusion is exciting and follows well from the preceding technical discussions: the mesoscale fluctuating quantities represented by parameters in correlation functions are relatively autonomous from their microscale constituents, and are further relatively universal across a wide variety of physical systems. They are the reliable, repeatable patterns that separate ontologically significant signals from random noise, so what else could be more obvious as the foundation of an ontology? In one of his more radical moments, Batterman even considers the point that if these mesoscale quantities were not so universal, then many of the features of the world that ontology aims to capture, such as the persistence of, say, bodies and cups, would not exist—and, therefore, that a metaphysics built solely upon the microphysics is more than likely to characterize a world very unlike our own.

The broad applicability of mesoscale parameters, according to Batterman, simply makes the variables representing these parameters more natural, by which he means “better able to figure in explanations . . .[and] provide descriptions and understanding of certain behaviors, than supposedly more ‘fundamental’ variables and parameters” (121). While I am sympathetic to this conclusion, the argument itself is not well-moored within the philosophical literatures on either classification or scientific metaphysics. This is disappointing, as Batterman hikes steep and well-trod philosophical ground here by calling into question both what grounds naturalness among the natural kinds, and why categories play such a central role in scientific reasoning in the first place. It would have been an exciting opportunity to cut a new a trail for hydrodynamic discourse on these topics by engaging with contemporary writers in these areas. For instance, there are connections to be drawn between Batterman’s argument here and contemporary philosophical work on naturalness and the practices of scientific classification by writers such as Cat (2016), Havstad (2021), Kendig and Grey (2021), Khalidi (2013), Magnus (2012), and this reviewer (Bursten 2016)—and this generation of work is itself informed by prior debates about science’s need for and uses of “natural” groupings from Richard Boyd, Ian Hacking, and others. Likewise, A Middle Way would find fellow travelers in anti-fundamentalist ontology in contemporary scientific metaphysicians including Dupré (e.g., 1993) and Waters (e.g., 2016).

Another central philosophical contribution from A Middle Way is an update of Batterman’s views on inter-theory relations, built partially from the ontological contribution on the naturalness of mesoscale parameters. Batterman has long presented upscaling, particularly via the mathematical techniques of the renormalization group, as a preferable alternative to reductionist or emergentist approaches to inter-theory relations in physics, and in his prior monograph he argued that the details of renormalization group techniques are themselves the rationale behind the success of certain types of physical explanation. This view played a central role in an ongoing debate about whether the mathematical techniques of upscaling via renormalization can—and whether they should—be reconciled with reductive approaches in philosophy of physics. (See, for instance, Butterfield 2011, Butterfield and Bouatta 2015, Saatsi and Reutlinger 2018, Morrison 2018, and Franklin and Robertson’s own forthcoming review of A Middle Way.) 

This debate tends toward the tiresome, as it frequently devolves into mere semantics: arguments turn on what one really means by reduction and what one really means by explanation more than on how scientific theories and models actually work and how they actually support the successful employment of mathematical models to explain physical phenomena. A Middle Way’s perspective is, however, invigorating: if one accepts the methodological approach of hydrodynamics, one can read an alternative account of inter-theory relations off this approach. This account is grounded in middle-out reasoning, characterized by (1) modeling fluctuations to connect mesoscale parameters to macroscale ones and (2) rationalizing the relative autonomy of mesoscale dynamics from microscale ones via minimal-model explanations. The account extends Batterman’s earlier work in this area and looks very unlike either a reductive or an emergentist account of how physical theories relate to one another.

Two further philosophical contributions should be highlighted. First, Batterman motivates the book with a discussion of two interrelated preoccupations of philosophers: the fundamental and the foundational. He characterizes concerns about fundamentality as regarding the relative priority of scientific theories in a hierarchy (e.g., perhaps quantum mechanics is more fundamental than classical mechanics, or perhaps physics is more fundamental than biology), while concerns about foundations regard core conceptual problems posed by a scientific theory (e.g., what is the correct interpretation of quantum mechanics?). Batterman paints an impressionistic portrait of the development of each of these concerns and claims that metaphysicians are drawn more toward the fundamental while philosophers of physics who analyze specific physical theories are typically attracted to foundational problems. This characterization is, in this reviewer’s view, accurate so far as it goes, but it lacks citations to any of the specific historical or contemporary philosophical dialogues that have formed the impressionistic portrait. This omission is clearly intentional, and the choice allows Batterman to arrive more quickly at the development of the hydrodynamic approach. However, as with the ontological contribution, this choice leaves the morals of the hydrodynamic approach somewhat removed from the philosophical dialectics they are intended to penetrate. It is a missed opportunity to connect with a broader community of philosophers who should (supposing the book’s arguments are correct) be the principal recipients Batterman’s instruction.

Second and finally, the most holistic philosophical contribution in A Middle Way is the lesson in hydrodynamic methods themselves. It is both an argument for a particular methodology in philosophy of physics and a demonstration of that methodology: careful attention to the technicalities that connect phenomena across multiple length, time, and energy scales is precisely what could liberate the philosophy of physics from its restrictive preoccupation with foundations. The message is important and forward-looking, and Batterman’s his lucid analysis and clear presentation of the scientific content makes evident how the hydrodynamic approach generates a new prescription for the ailments of philosophy of physics. 


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