A Mind and Its Time: The Development of Isaiah Berlin's Political Thought

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Joshua L. Cherniss, A Mind and Its Time: The Development of Isaiah Berlin's Political Thought, Oxford University Press, 2013, 264pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199673261.

Reviewed by James Schmidt, Boston University


This book is intended as both "a study of Isaiah Berlin's political thought" and "an exercise in intellectual biography" (vii). The political thought in question consists chiefly of Berlin's various accounts of the concept of liberty. His earlier writings on theories of meaning and epistemology -- along with his subsequent work in the history of ideas and the philosophy of history, and his discussions of "value pluralism" -- figure here only insofar as they help to clarify the evolution of Berlin's treatment of liberty. The rationale for adopting a biographical approach is grounded in Joshua Cherniss's conviction that the "inspiration, intended meaning, and historical significance" of Berlin's political thought become intelligible only when situated in the context of Berlin's "personal experiences and intellectual engagements" (vii).

The opening chapter traces Berlin's intellectual development from the beginning of his studies at Oxford in 1928 to the publication of his Karl Marx: His Life and Environment (1939). Chapter II discusses Berlin's wartime service in the United States on behalf of the British government and assesses the impact of his 1945 journey to the Soviet Union. Chapter III situates him within the cadre of Cold War liberals (e.g., Lionel Trilling, Reinhold Niebuhr, and Arthur Schlesinger) who made up the "non-Communist left" (68-69). Chapter IV addresses Berlin's reservations about the appeal of managerialism, planning, technocracy, conditioning, and scientism during the 1930s and 1940s, both within the British left and on American university campuses (Harvard in particular), where "the cramping effects of excessive public spiritedness" struck him as evidence of "an instrumentalist mindset" (97). The broader implications of these misgivings are explored in Chapter V, which examines Berlin's critique of utopian thought in general and E. H. Carr's approach to history in particular.

With Chapters VI-VIII the focus turns at last to Berlin's account of liberty. After a brief consideration of Berlin's earliest surviving discussion of the topic -- a 1928 essay written while he was a student at St. Paul's that embraced the sort of "teleological perfectionist conception of liberty" that he would later reject (132) -- Chapter VI chronicles the complex (and, as Cherniss notes, not always coherent) series of contrasts that Berlin drew between different conceptions of liberty in his 1952 Flexner lectures at Bryn Mawr College, which were published after his death as Political Ideas in the Romantic Age (2006). Chapter VII offers an exhaustive survey of the differing ways in which the contrast between positive and negative liberty had been drawn by thinkers with whom Berlin may have been familiar (e.g., Benjamin Constant, T. H. Green, Erich Fromm, T. D. Weldon, Franz Neumann, Bernard Bosanquet). It goes on to argue that Berlin was more likely to have been influenced (both positively and negatively) by the discussions he encountered in Rousseau, Kant, and John Stuart Mill, in works by contemporary advocates of social and economic planning (e.g., E. H. Carr, G. D. H. Cole, Harold Laski, and R. H. Tawney), and in early accounts of the rise of the totalitarian state (particularly J. L. Talmon's Origins of Totalitarian Democracy (1952)). Cherniss also offers a brief but fascinating discussion of Dorothy Fosdick's What is Liberty? (1939), a text that he sees as bearing a "striking" similarity to Berlin's own account (179-81).

Chapter VIII turns to Berlin's 1958 Oxford Inaugural lecture "Two Concepts of Liberty". Cherniss maintains that, by highlighting "the distinction between 'positive' and 'negative' liberty" and by "framing the discussion as an attempt to identify the correct definition of liberty," Berlin's best-known discussion of the concept of liberty "obscured his full position" (217). A final chapter concludes that Berlin's penchant for the "framing of complex issues in terms of seemingly simplistic dichotomies" (221) -- e.g., positive and negative liberty, pluralism and monism, Enlightenment and counter-Enlightenment, hedgehogs and foxes -- coupled with an overriding "anxiety about threats to freedom and individuality" (228) has tended to obscure his more subtle understanding of liberalism and, ultimately, his treatment of the concept of liberty itself. Cherniss argues that Berlin viewed liberalism as opposed, not to socialism, but instead to "uniformity and authoritarianism" (225) and that he saw positive and negative conceptions of liberty as ultimately grounded in a "basic" conception of liberty that included aspects of both (193-94).

This hasty summary can only begin to indicate the considerable strengths of this study. Cherniss has read broadly and exhaustively not only in Berlin's own writings (both published and unpublished), but also in the works of Berlin's acquaintances and contemporaries. The book's virtues are apparent as early as the opening chapter's extended discussion of Berlin's intellectual development, which -- calling into question Berlin's later emphasis on the discontinuity between his early "philosophical" interests and his subsequent work in the history of ideas -- demonstrates the degree to which the Berlin's later concerns (notably, his account of value pluralism) were influenced by the work of J. L. Austin and the Oxford "realist" John Cook Wilson (44-52). In much the same fashion, his account of the genesis of Berlin's book on Karl Marx casts light both on the origins of Berlin's subsequent engagement with nineteenth-century Russian literature (33-37) and on his later critique of the alleged "rationalism" of the Enlightenment (40-41).

But the book's most significant contribution lies in its exhaustive discussion of Berlin's familiar -- albeit deeply problematic -- account of the distinction between positive and negative liberty. Cherniss offers what is likely to be the definitive account of the various ways in which Berlin framed the dichotomy, both in the Flexner lectures and in the initial drafts of his Oxford lecture. The following passage may suffice to indicate the complexities of Berlin's formulation:

Berlin's account of 'positive' freedom encompassed definitions of freedom as self-determination or self-rule (whether this meant personal independence, or political self-legislation); and as the ability to achieve (or actual achievement of) satisfaction, fulfillment, or self-realization. He also articulated the relationship between "negative" and "positive" liberty in different ways, sometimes treating them as answers to different questions, sometimes as features of different intellectual traditions or movements. Sometimes he defined "negative" and "positive" liberty, respectively, as "freedom from" and "freedom to"; sometimes as "political" and "moral" liberty; or as arising from conceptions of liberty as instrumentally or intrinsically valuable; or as liberty as distinguished from the conditions for liberty versus liberty conflated with its conditions (216-17).

Cherniss goes on to note that Berlin "did not hold consistently to any of these distinctions" and that the "diversity, indeed confusion" that marks his presentation of the distinction between positive and negative liberty was the consequence of an attempt "to draw together a number of (often overlapping and already confused) debates and traditions of thinking about liberty under a single dichotomy" (217). He concludes that the way in which Berlin presented this dichotomy in "Two Concepts of Liberty" ultimately "distorts his intentions and insights, and obstructs comprehension of his true position" (217).

Cherniss suggests that the motivation for this drastic simplification may, in part, be traced to Berlin's penchant for "framing . . . complex issues in terms of seemingly simplistic dichotomies" such as pluralism and monism, Enlightenment and Counter-Enlightenment, and, most famously, hedgehogs and foxes (221). But he argues that the main impetus for the stark contrast between positive and negative liberty can be found in the historical context from which it issued. Conceding that Leo Strauss's characterization of "Two Concepts of Liberty" as "an anti-communist manifesto" may well be "largely accurate," Cherniss observes that -- despite Berlin's affinities with such representatives of "the non-Communist Left" as Arthur Schlesinger, Jr., Reinhold Niebuhr, Sidney Hook, and Arthur Koestler -- his own anti-Communism tended to be considerably "more tempered and nuanced," chiefly because its roots went deeper. The advent of the Cold War converted other Western liberals to a position that Berlin had already reached in the 1930s as a result of his reading the works of Alexander Herzen, Pyotr Lavrov, and Nikolay Mikhailovsky (87).

As a result of these political and intellectual commitments, Berlin's discussions of the concept of liberty tended to have an "anxious, defensive" character: their principal concern was the "dangers to liberty" (218). Not least among these dangers were those that resided in certain interpretations of the concept of liberty itself. Hence, while the Flexner lectures included passages that recognized -- and, indeed, stressed -- the importance of such positive conceptions of liberty as self-actualization, self-ownership, and self-control (189-90), Berlin's eventual reformulation of the distinction between positive and negative liberty in the "Two Concepts" lecture downplayed the affinities they shared and emphasized the gulf that separated them.

One of the lessons of A Mind and its Time would appear to be that Berlin's times weighed rather heavily on his mind. In this he was not alone; the same might be said of the other Cold War liberals who populate the book's third chapter. As Cherniss observes, many of them shared Berlin's acute concern for the threats to liberty posed by economic and social planning and -- again like Berlin -- were troubled by the spread of modes of thought that they characterized as technocratic and scientistic. Many of them also shared his reservations about unrestrained capitalism, his support for certain socialistic measures, and his distaste for the more extreme forms of anti-Communism that erupted at the close of the 1940s. But, as Cherniss demonstrates, negotiating the tensions between these various and sometimes conflicting concerns and commitments was no simple task. Typically, something had to give.

What Cold War liberals were prepared to surrender in their attempt to craft a tougher form of liberalism varied from case to case. For some -- including Berlin -- the toughening took the form of an increased skepticism about the notion of progress, an idea once central to the liberal project but now suspect as a naïve vestige of Enlightenment rationalism and, in any case, now viewed as tainted with Marxist associations (123). For others, it involved a retreat from earlier commitments to the cause of social justice. While Berlin had long been leery of the cult of "progress", he was also wary (as he wrote in a 1966 letter to Bernard Crick) of "fanatical individualists -- anti-planners, laissez-fairists, Hayekites." They not only tended to "elevate uninterference into a supreme goal" and thus ignore the rival claims of "security, justice, equality, and simply humanity." They also were unable to see that certain liberties might "perish without social planning" (224).

The portrait of Berlin that emerges from this book differs markedly from the stock image of him as a relentless critic of positive liberty. Cherniss stresses that a précis of the "Two Concepts" lecture that appears in an autobiographical retrospective written at the end of Berlin's life characterized positive and negative liberty as "cognate" (see the selections from "My Intellectual Path" in Isaiah Berlin, Liberty, ed. Henry Hardy (2002, p. 326)). Drawing on this discussion, he argues that Berlin regarded both forms of liberty as "derived from the same root" -- a basic or essential conception of liberty that was defined by "the ability to choose between conceivable alternatives" (193). Because basic liberty includes positive notions such as "self-determination, self-ownership, and self-expression," it cannot (though Cherniss notes, it was Berlin's "occasional practice" to do so) be equated with "negative liberty" (193-94).

It is, however, unclear that Berlin's invocation of basic liberty can carry the weight that Cherniss seeks to place on it. In the passage at issue Berlin explains that when he set out to investigate "the two central senses of 'liberty'" he "realised that they differed, that they were answers to two different questions; but, although cognate, they did not in my view clash -- the answer to one did not necessarily determine the answer to the other" (Liberty 326). Matters would be simpler had Berlin written "because cognate" rather than "although cognate." But as things stand, the possibility that positive and negative liberty may derive from a common root is of less importance for Berlin than the claim that the two concepts respond to different questions, with negative liberty addressing the question "How far am I controlled?" and positive liberty responding to the question "Who controls me?" (Liberty 327). To formulate the distinction in this way is to see it, not as a claim about rival historical traditions (as had been one of Berlin's aims in the Flexner lectures) but instead as a distinction in the way in which the concept "liberty" is employed. If Berlin is read in this way -- which, after all, is how discussions of the "Two Concepts" lecture have typically proceeded -- it is unclear that Berlin's inchoate notion of a basic liberty is preferable to alternative formulations -- for example, Gerald C. MacCallum's suggestion that liberty might best be understood as triadic relationship involving (1) agents, (2) constraints, and (3) "actions or conditions of character or circumstance" that, depending on how these three elements are specified, can yield a variety of possible interpretations ("Negative and Positive Freedom," The Philosophical Review 76:3 (1967): 312-34).

Berlin, however, seems to have been less interested in providing an account of basic liberty than in tracing the various "perversions" that both positive and negative had spawned. And, for him, perversions of the positive conception were always "more frightful" than those inspired by the negative conception (see, for example, Liberty 328). While Cherniss makes a strong case that Berlin's views on liberty and liberalism were far more complex than the argument he laid out in "Two Concepts of Liberty," he is abundantly aware that, in the end, Berlin's account of liberty "was directed against and shaped by his response to contemporary political forces and tendencies" (219). Not the least of the merits of A Mind in its Time is that, by exploring the wealth of material that has appeared since Berlin's death, it helps us to appreciate the complexities of Berlin's treatment of the concept of liberty. But it also suggests that the complexity of this thought tended to be trumped by the exigencies of his times.