A Minimal Libertarianism: Free Will and the Promise of Reduction

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Christopher Evan Franklin, A Minimal Libertarianism: Free Will and the Promise of Reduction, Oxford University Press, 2018, 248pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190682781.

Reviewed by Randolph Clarke, Florida State University


Franklin advances here a limited and qualified defense of an event-causal libertarian theory of free will and moral responsibility. The limitation is to the question of conceptual adequacy; he does not address whether the required indeterminism exists. The qualification is that provided that agency admits of an event-causal reduction, the libertarian theory in question is said to be adequate. Franklin professes uncertainty about whether this proviso can be met.

What is minimal about Franklin's libertarian theory is that it differs from a promising event-causal compatibilist theory only in requiring non-deterministic causation at certain points. No additional efforts of will, torn decisions, or ontologically fundamental agent causation are required. Franklin first argues for the requirement of indeterminism, then defends minimal libertarianism against charges that the indeterminism that it requires would diminish agents' control, or at any rate would not enhance it. Lastly, he turns to an examination of agency reductionism.

Franklin's target is the freedom required for a kind of moral responsibility known as accountability, which can render agents deserving of praise or blame for their conduct. Praise and blame are said to consist in various reactive attitudes, such as gratitude, resentment, and indignation. To determine what kind of freedom accountability requires, Franklin undertakes an examination of when and why pleas for excuse or exemption render such attitudes inappropriate. What explains the normative force of exemptions, he argues, is that the agents in question fail to satisfy a requirement of normative competence, which is constituted by a number of abilities and capacities that Franklin (following R. Jay Wallace) calls powers of reflective self-control. The normative force of excuses, on the other hand, is said to be explained by failure to satisfy a requirement of reasonable opportunity to avoid doing what one does. Given this second requirement, accountability for a given action requires having freedom over one's will -- or free will -- having which is having "the opportunity to exercise one's will in more than one way" (48).

The powers of reflective self-control, Franklin maintains, are what are commonly called general abilities. These are relatively stable states of agents, grounded in agents' intrinsic properties. They don't come and go just because, say, an agent is asleep, or even knocked unconscious. And Franklin accepts that one can have an ability of this kind to avoid doing what one does even if it is determined that one do that thing. What determinism would preclude, he argues, is the requisite opportunity to do otherwise.

Franklin advances the following thesis about opportunity:

S has the opportunity to φ at time t in possible world W iff there is a possible world W* in which Sφs at t, and, at the very least, everything except S's φ-ing and any event that depends on S's φ-ing are the same as in W. (70)

(An event depends on an agent's action just in case it is generated -- causally, constitutively, or otherwise -- by that action.) The first premise in his "No Opportunity Argument" for incompatibilism is then:

An agent S in a deterministic world W has the opportunity to do otherwise at time t only if there is a possible world W* in which S does otherwise at t, and, at the very least, everything except S's doing otherwise and any event that depends on his doing otherwise are the same as in W. (72)

Compatibilists will no doubt reject the thesis concerning opportunity as well as the premise based on it (some Humean compatibilists will reject a further premise of Franklin's argument concerning laws); but the thesis, and hence this first premise, are problematic for reasons unrelated to the compatibility question.

Imagine that Sam's neighbor needs his help at t, and Sam simply doesn't give a fig about his neighbor or what he needs. Suppose that Sam would help his neighbor at t only if by that time he took an interest in doing so, and that he can by t take an interest in helping his neighbor then. Sam's lack of interest is not his lacking an opportunity to help his neighbor, though Franklin's thesis about opportunity apparently implies that it is, for any world in which Sam helps will differ in some way that is neither his act of helping nor an event dependent on that act. Similarly, suppose that Ann promises to get milk on the way home but forgets to do so. Suppose that she would get the milk only if she remembered to do so. If she is able to remember, her forgetting is not her lacking an opportunity to get the milk.

Franklin says that an agent lacks an opportunity to do a certain thing only if there is a decisive obstacle to her doing that thing. Neither lack of interest nor forgetting is a decisive obstacle. (Lack of milk at the store or a road closure might constitute such an obstacle for Ann). Indeed, the idea that determinism might preclude free will by limiting opportunity, or by presenting obstacles, is rather peculiar. Franklin helps his case by noting that his use of 'opportunity' is somewhat stipulative, that he uses the term to refer to what other writers call specific ability. But absent some clinical disorder, neither lack of interest nor forgetting is a disabling condition, either. In short, "I don't care" and "I forgot" are simply not excuses.

Franklin sometimes suggests a more liberal formulation of the thesis about opportunity. He says at one point:

It seems that if something must change in order for me to φ, and this change is not something that would be an exercise of my agency or depend on an exercise of my agency, then the required change constitutes a decisive obstacle to my φ-ing. (83)

In line with this remark, an agent might have an opportunity to φ even if one of the things that would have to be different were she to φ is some exercise of her agency other than, and prior to, her φ-ing. But even the more liberal formulation can be challenged independently of the question of compatibilism. If Ann's memory is good enough that she could have simply remembered to get the milk -- without having to exercise her agency to so remember (as we commonly can) -- she might have had all it takes to have a specific ability, and thus an opportunity in Franklin's sense, to get the milk.

Having drawn his incompatibilist conclusion, Franklin turns to the question of where in causal processes event-causal libertarians should require indeterminism. He raises forceful objections to views that confine it to moments in deliberation prior to judgments about what would be best to do; he does the same against Robert Kane's well-known libertarian theory. Some of the points Franklin makes here have been made before, though he has some fresh observations as well. He concludes that "we should only require that free agents' reasons nondeterministically bring about their basic actions" (106).

A basic action, such as a choice, that satisfies this requirement of indeterminism as well as requirements that might be shared with compatibilist theories is termed a basic free action. Franklin states his minimal event-causal libertarianism as follows:

An agent S's action φ at time t was directly free and one he was directly morally responsible for iff (i) S was normatively competent with respect to φ at t, (ii) φ was a basic action, (iii) S's reasons [R] that favored φ nondeviantly brought about φ at t, and (iv) it was possible, given the past and the laws of nature up until t, that R not have caused φ. (108)

In a gloss, Franklin says that, according to (iv),

Free agents must possess the opportunity to refrain from exercising their abilities of reflective self-control as they actually do exercise them: they must possess the opportunity to exercise their powers of reflective self-control in more than one way (e.g., by not exercising them at all). (108)

Note that the requirement gets several non-equivalent formulations here. Suppose that when an agent φs at t, with her action caused by reasons R, the only alternative to her φ-ing then that is compossible with the laws and pre-t history is that R cause her immediate death. That would satisfy the initial statement of requirement (iv), but it would not satisfy the gloss, since the agent would lack the opportunity to refrain from exercising her abilities at t, and she would lack the opportunity to exercise her powers in more than one way then. Further, of course, not exercising one's powers is not a way of exercising them. The different formulations appear throughout the book, though "the opportunity to exercise her powers in more than one way" seems to appear most frequently, and a requirement securing this might be what is intended. Evaluation of whether Franklin's proposed theory solves the problems he subsequently presents would be helped by greater clarity on just what the theory requires.

Two further questions can be raised about the adequacy of the view as stated. First, while Franklin has argued that an agent deserves blame for φ-ing only if she had a reasonable opportunity to avoid φ-ing, we might wonder whether being blameworthy requires having had an opportunity to avoid blame. If φ-ing is blameworthy and so would have been exercising one's powers in some other way in which one had the opportunity to exercise them, an agent would need a further opportunity if she is to satisfy the latter requirement, though it is not clear that minimal libertarianism requires this. Second, while Franklin notes that manipulation cases pose a serious difficulty for compatibilism, he does not consider that they might pose a difficulty, as well, for minimal libertarianism. Consider a case of mid-life manipulation that so alters an agent's psychology that subsequently she has opportunities to do at a certain time t only one or another of two things both of which she would have regarded as unthinkable prior to the manipulation. Imagine that the manipulation leaves the agent with (as she had before) the abilities and capacities constituting normative competence. The accountability of this agent for what she does at t is questionable, just as is that of an agent subject to manipulation in a deterministic world. Yet just as the latter might satisfy all non-historical requirements of compatibilist accounts, so the former, it seems, might satisfy all the requirements of minimal libertarianism.

The two main problems with which Franklin confronts his theory he calls the problem of luck and the problem of enhanced control. The first, as Franklin construes it, concerns the charge that the indeterminism required by minimal libertarianism would diminish agents' control, the second that the indeterminism would not increase control. The first has been part of the critique of libertarian theories at least since Hobbes, and it takes several forms. Franklin addresses a dated version of the problem that assumes that all causes necessitate their effects; he addresses recent presentations of it in terms of ensuring that something will happen, in terms of a rollback of the course of events, and in terms of contrastive explanation. His replies are astute, and in the last case quite bold; if minimal libertarianism is true, Franklin argues, every directly free action can be contrastively explained.

However, there are presentations of the luck problem that appeal to neither necessitation, ensurance, rollbacks, nor explanation. One might worry, for example, that unfoldings of the indeterministic processes required by event-causal libertarian theories are similar enough to those of a genuinely indeterministic number generator that whatever control the agent might have over whether she does one thing or another falls short of what is needed for moral responsibility.[1] Note that with this presentation (as with some others) what is at issue is not whether the required indeterminism would diminish control but whether it would preclude responsibility.

In responding to the problem of enhanced control, Franklin takes on proponents of agent-causal libertarian theories, who argue that only a requirement of fundamental agent causation -- causation by an agent that does not consist in causation by events or states -- can secure more control than that available on compatibilist views. Franklin makes a good case for the compatibility of fundamental agent causation with determinism, and even with causal determinism (on which every event, even every agent-causal event if there are such, is causally determined). He then presses the following challenge: if agent-causal libertarianism can secure more control than agent-causal compatibilism, when the former differs from the latter merely in lacking determinism at certain points, why cannot event-causal libertarianism secure more control than event-causal compatibilism, when the difference is the same mere lack of determinism? While there might be good responses to this challenge, Franklin does well to present it in a forceful way.

Of course, theorists who doubt that even agent-causal theories secure more control than do event-causal compatibilist views, or hold that even if they do, they do not secure what is needed for free will, will be unmoved by Franklin's challenge to agent-causalists. Franklin's positive response to the problem of enhanced control rests on his claim that "agents' control is constituted by not just what they have the ability to do but also what they have the opportunity to do" (157). Thus,

indeterminism located at the moment of basic action in a normatively competent agent is relevant to enhancing control because it furnishes agents with opportunities to exercise their powers of reflective self-control (powers constitutive of normative competence) in more than one way. (166)

It would have strengthened Franklin's argument here had he considered and replied to two rejoinders. First, even if agents' control is constituted not just by abilities but also by opportunities, and even if indeterminism opens up opportunities, thus altering agents' control, it does not follow that indeterminism increases control. Not every alteration is an increase. Second, even if the required indeterminism increases agents' control, it does not follow that the theory provides what is needed for free will. Even an increase can leave too little.

In his final chapter (prior to a brief conclusion and an appendix on Frankfurt cases), Franklin turns to consideration of agency reductionism, on which minimal libertarianism relies. After responding to Derk Pereboom's Disappearing Agent Argument (which is intended to show that fundamental agent causation is needed for an adequate theory of free will) Franklin presents an argument of his own to the effect that agency of at least one kind, self-determining agency, can't exist if all of the causes of actions are events or states. While he does not endorse the argument, Franklin contends "that it presents an as of yet unsolved challenge for agency reductionism and, consequently, that the tenability of agency reductionism in general, and event-causal libertarianism in particular, are uncertain" (172). As he observes, the problem does not concern indeterminism per se; it strikes as forcefully at event-causal compatibilist theories of free will as it does at minimal libertarianism.

Franklin's "It Ain't Me Argument" is an exclusion argument. If an agent's causal contribution to a certain decision is exhausted by the causal contribution of some bundle of events and states, it claims, then the agent self-determines that decision only if the agent is identical to at least some members of this bundle of events and states. Franklin sees just two options for agency reductionists: they can claim that an agent is indeed identical with some bundle of events and states, or they can claim that an agent can be identified with certain of her attitudes, which then "speak for her," and whose playing a causal role in every case of self-determining agency thus counts as the agent's playing that causal role. Franklin finds problems with both options. He considers as well denying that self-determination is required for either free will or moral responsibility but rejects this move as contrary to our experience.

Depending on what agency reduction comes to, its proponents might have a more promising option than any of these three. Consider the view that there are causal processes, fundamentally involving causation by events or states, that suffice for, because they fully constitute, exercises of agency of various kinds, including self-determining agency. Stated this way, the view incurs no commitment to there being any events or states whose causal roles, in every exercise of agency, count as the causal role of the agent. In fact, this view is not committed to the idea that in every exercise of agency, the agent causes something. Franklin takes it for granted that proponents of event-causal theories of agency will accept this agent-causal claim, contesting only the further claim that the agent causation is fundamental. Not all do. Even if one does, one might hold that there are a variety of event- or state-causal processes each of which is sufficient for agency, and hence for agent causation, and none of which is necessary. If it is still thought that there is an exclusion problem, it will help to note that constituted phenomena are as real as the phenomena that constitute them.

Despite my dissatisfaction with Franklin's conclusion of this last chapter, I found his discussion here among the most exciting and interesting of the book. While much of the rest covers fairly well trod territory, here he sets off into new fields. I hope to see the issues he raises here explored further.

Franklin has given us a well written, closely argued, and vigorous defense of a quite simple libertarian theory of free will and moral responsibility. Although I am not convinced on every point, I think the debate is enriched by his contribution. Philosophers interested in these topics should read this book.

[1] Alfred R. Mele, “Moral Responsibility and the Continuation Problem,” Philosophical Studies 162 (2013): 237-55.