A Miracle Creed: The Principle of Optimality in Leibniz’s Physics and Philosophy

A Miracle Creed

Jeffrey K. McDonough, A Miracle Creed: The Principle of Optimality in Leibniz’s Physics and Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2022, 234pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197629079.

Reviewed by Richard T. W. Arthur, McMaster University


In this engaging and original study, Jeffrey McDonough promotes a new way of understanding the interrelation between Leibniz’s metaphysics and his contributions to the science of his time. This understanding is in terms of what he calls Leibniz’s Principle of Optimality, the idea that underlying the complexity of the phenomena of nature there is an immanent optimal form, the recognition of which can lead to the explanation of phenomena by elegant means. McDonough constructs his argument through an analysis of several of Leibniz’s solutions to specific technical problems in natural philosophy: Chapter 1 is on Leibniz’s derivation of the laws of reflection and refraction by applying a minimization principle to derive the easiest path; Chapter 2 is on his provision of a derivation of the correct formula for the fracture strength of a beam to match Edme Mariotte’s experimental results; Chapter 3 is on his promotion of the conservation of vis viva; Chapter 4 is on the catenary or hanging chain problem; and Chapter 5 is on Johann Bernoulli’s problem of the brachistochrone, that is, the path of most rapid descent. Each of these studies was published by Leibniz as an article in the Acta eruditorum of Leipzig, so we are dealing here with the actual contributions Leibniz made in the public forum to the science of his time, as opposed to the various pearls he secreted in the archives that scholars have only discovered later (such as his finding a wonderfully accurate numerical value for the exponential constant e, or his unpublished work on matrices or the binary system). Moreover, with the exception of the significance of his discovery of the conservation of vis viva, there has been comparatively little scholarly analysis of these topics.

This would be enough in its own right to recommend the book as essential reading for the historian of natural philosophy, but the icing on the cake is the way McDonough connects these studies through the idea that they are all built around the notion of optimal form, and his adroit use of that motif to illuminate contested issues about the development of Leibniz’s wider philosophy. For what these examples all illustrate, according to McDonough, is Leibniz’s commitment to an immanent lawful teleology, but one that escapes many traditional objections to teleological explanation, and in fact lays the groundwork for an approach to the foundations that many consider to lie at the heart of modern physics.

In his 1682 article “A Unitary Principle for Optics, Catoptrics and Dioptrics” Leibniz identified this unitary principle as follows: “Light radiating from a point reaches an illuminated point by the easiest path” (13). He did not claim any priority for the principle of the minimal path itself, which he attributed to Fermat, Snell, and others before them, but saw it rather as a “principle of metaphysics” that he applied “to bring about an agreement with the mechanical principle of the composition of motions”, as he later explained to Pfautz (A III 3, 806). Of course, this glosses over the signal contribution that Leibniz had himself developed, but did not reveal until his Nova methodus of 1684, namely the way he had derived the result using his new differential calculus to determine maxima or minima via differentiation of an equation describing the line (—here it should be noted, though, that differentiation for Leibniz is not “taking the derivative” (17), but taking differences or differentials; derivatives were a later development of calculus). Leibniz used a similar method to solve Johann Bernoulli’s brachistochrone problem in 1696, finding the optimal path by minimizing the time a particle would take to traverse it (176); but even closer to the reasoning of the “Unitary Principle” paper was Johann Bernoulli’s own solution, which rephrased the problem as finding “the curve a light ray would follow on its way through a medium whose density is inversely proportional to the velocity that a heavy body acquires during it fall” (176). Both of these solutions to the brachistochrone, and also Jacob Bernoulli’s, exploit the principle of optimality that Leibniz had first developed in his paper on optics.

As McDonough shows elegantly in his later chapters, the same principle underlies Leibniz’s solutions to the apparently quite distinct problems of determining the fracture strength of beams and the shape of a hanging chain. The former consisted in a deft solution to a problem first discussed by Galileo in his Discorsi, that of determining the proportionality factor between the force required to break a beam by a weight pulling down on its end, and that required to break it by pulling horizontally. By assuming an absolutely rigid beam and a sudden break, Galileo had determined this ratio to be ½. Mariotte informed Leibniz that Galileo’s measure was too high, and that he had calculated it to be ¼. Leibniz, basing his analysis on Mariotte’s assumption that matter consisted of elastic fibers, recalculated it to be ⅓, a result Mariotte then confirmed experimentally. Leibniz’s reasoning involved determining that the optimal configuration of the beam was that in which the elastic force would be distributed continuously throughout.

An even more striking example of optimal form is provided by Leibniz’s solution to the catenary problem. This was a problem already treated by Galileo and Christiaan Huygens, but when Jacob Bernoulli suggested that it was also amenable to a treatment by the calculus, Leibniz promoted it to a challenge problem. In his solution he treated the hanging chain as a “string which is easily flexible in all its parts” (135), reminiscently of the beam, and sought to determine the shape of the string that maximizes its overall descent as a whole. In a remarkable demonstration of the power of his calculus, Leibniz derived the equation of the curved shape as a hyperbolic cosine, and for good measure, derived expressions for the tangent, the arc length, the area under the curve, and the center of gravity as well. It is a feature of the catenary that its shape does not imply a maximization of the descent of every one of its segments (135): what appears locally like a more optimal path may in fact derogate from the optimality of the whole system. Secondly, every section of a catenary is itself a catenary.

In the remaining sections of this chapter (Chapter 4), McDonough uses these latter facts about the catenary to provide what he calls “an unlikely model of the will” (138). His idea is this: Leibniz claims that an individual seeking to maximize what it perceives to be best from its own point of view (subjective teleology) nevertheless acts in such a way as to optimize the perfection of the world in which it exists (objective teleology). These two commitments have been thought to lead to tension, if not outright inconsistency, in Leibniz’s thinking about the will. McDonough argues, however, that “Leibniz’s notion of an optimal form furnishes him with an extremely elegant picture of how the laws of objective and subjective teleology may be reconciled” (144). Just as each section of the catenary is an element necessary for the optimization of the whole catenary yet the catenary as a whole is the result of the optimization of these elements, so each monad evolves spontaneously in accordance with what appears best from its own local perspective (subjective teleology), while nevertheless contributing to the realization of the best of all possible worlds (objective teleology) (145). In the remainder of the chapter, McDonough explores the further implications of this model for understanding the role of reason in determining optimal courses of action.

As noted, each of McDonough’s case studies is adroitly interwoven with interesting discussions of its significance for understanding the development of Leibniz’s philosophy. Chapter 1 on the Unitary Principle of optics already raises questions about the status of teleological explanations. For the easiest path explanation of the reflection and refraction of light rays explicitly presupposes the endpoint of the ray as part of the explanans, the telos towards which the process is directed. Many modern thinkers, following Descartes and Spinoza, have found this problematic, insisting that the explanation of a phenomenon must involve the identification of its efficient cause in order to be satisfactory. But as McDonough argues, far from denying efficient causes, Leibniz insisted on their compatibility with final cause explanations. The latter kind of explanations, nowadays called “teleonomic”, have tremendous utility in finding solutions to problems, especially when the relevant causal history cannot be determined.

In Chapter 3, McDonough argues that Leibniz’s commitment to the notion of optimal form, stemming from his work in optics, has great bearing on his change of mind concerning the necessity of the laws of nature. His change of mind in the late 1670s to insisting on their contingency has standardly been assimilated to the emergence of his dynamics. When he formulated the principle that he took to be the new basis of this emerging science in 1676, the Principle of Equipollence, according to which there is the same power in the entire effect as in the full cause, he initially thought that he could derive the laws of mechanics from it as necessary truths. His subsequent change of mind to regarding the laws as contingent is thought to have resulted partly from his inability to prove the principle itself, and partly from a growing realization of the threat to morality from Spinozist necessitarianism. But McDonough argues persuasively that neither factor is adequate to explain Leibniz’s embrace of contingency. On the one hand, Leibniz had previously been confident that he could resist Spinozism without embracing contingency, and on the other “neither the conservation of vis viva nor the Equality Principle seem like especially compelling or illuminating examples of Leibnizian contingency in nature” (109). It is otherwise, though, with Leibniz’s work in optics, where contingency is implicit in the principle of optimality that first appears in a paper dated 1677. Leibniz’s embrace of contingency, McDonough concludes, “was driven first and foremost by his studies in optics rather than his work in dynamics” (117).

To this analysis I would add two riders. The first is that in the first draft of Scheda 7 of his De corporum concorsu of early 1678, written prior to his discovery that mv2 rather than impulse was the correct measure of force, Leibniz had sketched a derivation of the Principle of Equipollence by an argument appealing to a minimization of change of state. The second is that what Leibniz stresses as having philosophical significance in the Brevis Demonstratio is not the conservation of vis viva, which he does not explicitly announce there. Rather, he stresses the fact that force must be estimated with respect to its future effect: the power a pendulum bob has at the top of its swing when it is motionless cannot be reduced to impulse. Both these points, nevertheless, reinforce McDonough’s overall line of argument that the driving force behind Leibniz’s thought is his commitment to an “immanent lawful teleology”.

Perhaps the most provocative of McDonough’s suggestions regarding the implications of his case studies, though, occurs in his discussion in Chapter 2 on rigid beams. As we saw, Leibniz had determined that the optimal configuration of the beam was that in which the elastic force would be distributed continuously throughout. McDonough interprets this as his giving “a model for Leibnizian bodies” (80). In this way he seeks to make a novel intervention in the ongoing debate among Leibniz interpreters concerning the relationship between monads (simple substances) and corporeal substances, and at the same time to clarify the relationship between derivative and primitive forces. His idea is that, just as in the treatment of the fracture strength of a beam the assumption of discrete cells or fibers in bodies gives way in the limit to a continuous distribution of idealized point forces, so “it seems reasonable to suppose that Leibnizian primitive forces should correspond to the unobservable point forces that Leibniz argues must be present in the limit as the length of the beam’s segments goes to zero” (76). In neither case, he reasons, are the point-forces parts of the extended body, nor are they homogeneous with it, thus respecting Leibniz’s strictures that monads are not parts of the extended bodies they constitute. “Primitive forces are no more literally parts of derivative forces than are particle motions literally parts of heat” (79). Accordingly, he urges, this provides “a strikingly literal model of how monads relate to extended bodies” (89). Extended bodies can literally be aggregates of monads, as Leibniz often claimed, and substances can be regarded as being in bodies in a literal sense.

Here, I suggest, more caution is needed. One can make sense of Leibniz’s claim that a monad “is in” a body in the sense of its being presupposed by the body as an immediate requisite or necessary condition for the body’s existence, and one that is prior by nature to it. This is the same sense as that in which a soul “is in” the body it informs: the soul must be, at least in a derivative sense, where the body is acting and perceiving, since the perceptions in the soul correspond to the situation of the body. But McDonough’s interpretation reduces monads or primitive forces to limit-entities, akin to Johann Bernoulli’s interpretation of them as “living points”. To that suggestion Leibniz responded: “I think there is no smallest animal or living thing, that there is none without an organic body, none whose body is not, in turn, divided into many substances. Therefore, one will never arrive at living points, that is, points endowed with forms” (11 November 1698; AG 168). Here, as elsewhere, Leibniz is rejecting the idea of monads as point-entities resulting in the limit from the actually infinite division of bodies.

In his final chapter, McDonough gives an intriguing and informative analysis of the implications of the mature manifestation of Leibniz’s Principle of Optimality in various treatments of the brachistochrone problem. The solutions of Leibniz and of the Bernoulli brothers all exploited the same method, “the procedure of finding an equation describing a family of paths, and using the calculus to find a path that is stationary with respect to its infinitely close neighbors” (177). As McDonough explains, Euler’s further development of this principle from Jacob Bernoulli’s solution began the creation of variational mechanics, and variational principles such as that of least action are now regarded as foundational in relativity and quantum mechanics.

In 1950 Einstein conjectured that insight into nature can be gained by “pure thought” on the basis of “premises of great simplicity”, something the skeptic will term a “miracle creed” (1). Leibniz’s fecund idea of a nature based on optimal forms, urges McDonough, is just such a miracle creed. Those interested in Leibniz’s philosophy and in the history of physical theory will not want to miss this beautifully argued and thought-provoking study of this central idea in his thinking.