A Moral Defense of Recreational Drug Use

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Rob Lovering, A Moral Defense of Recreational Drug Use, Palgrave Macmillan, 2015, 218pp., $75.35 (hbk), ISBN 9781137548764.

Reviewed by Lester Hunt, University of Wisconsin-Madison


As its title indicates, this book is about the moral status of "recreational" drug use. It is not about whether such behavior is prudent, nor whether it ought to be legally permitted. Its topic area is further constrained by Rob Lovering's apparent assumptions that the only moral statuses that such drug use might have that are relevant to his discussion are those of being morally permitted and being morally impermissible (or at least morally criticizable, an idea he introduces in the first chapter but which seems to play little if any role in the discussion that follows). In addition, he apparently assumes that the way to prove that something is permitted is simply to answer all the possible arguments for the conclusion that it is impermissible. Given that there are many possible arguments here, and that few of them have much plausibility, you might think that this would make for some tedious reading. I am sorry to say that you would be right. Before I had gotten very far in reading this book, I got the distinct impression that perhaps I am not supposed to be reading it straight through. It might work better as a reference work. The index, which is very good, makes it a very simple matter to find any particular moral argument against drugs and see what the author thinks is wrong with it.

Unfortunately, I don't think the book would serve very well, even for this limited purpose. Lovering's replies to these arguments are mostly of the sort that might occur to a bright undergraduate writing a paper for a moral issues course: they contain few surprises and no big ones. They typically consist in showing that a given reason for thinking that taking drugs is morally wrong would also mean that some other act is morally wrong, and that the latter conclusion would strain credulity. I think his replies are nearly always sound, but I must add that I learned little from them. One feature of this book that I did learn from is the quotations, and there are a great many of them, from other philosophers and authorities on drugs. Many of these were unfamiliar to me, and some were quite interesting. It is clear the Lovering has done his reading.

As far as philosophical substance is concerned, I think the most serious single fault of his approach is that he never makes any effort whatsoever to explain why someone would find the arguments he is criticizing persuasive in the first place. This is particularly glaring in his discussion of the one moral argument against drugs that seems to me to be (mind you, this is not an endorsement) taken seriously: this is the idea that such behavior eventually degrades one's character, that it makes one a worse person. He sets the argument up by presenting quotations, mostly saying the same thing and less than a sentence long, from three proponents of this view (Peter de Marneffe, William Bennett, and James Q. Wilson). It seems to me that the degradation argument (as Lovering calls it) has something to be said for it, but that what this something is can only be brought out if one sympathetically fleshes the argument out with some details, preferably using an example or two, before beginning to attack it. This, however, Lovering does not do. Rather, he launches straight into an attack on this poorly-motivated semi-strawman of an argument.

To be fair, his attack on this particular argument does go well beyond posing a more or less obvious counterexample. Nonetheless, I think it falls far short of its intended target. He first asserts that the degradation argument assumes "virtue ethics" and launches into a discussion of what virtue ethics is and a quick argument that is apparently supposed to show that this virtue ethics is simply wrong. He asks us to imagine that someone has been introduced by a friend to that friend's parents, and that the friend then asks, hoping for a positive response, what he thought of them. It so happens that he was just thinking that they represent everything that he despises. What should he do? The virtues that are most obviously relevant -- honesty and compassion, say -- lead to different answers to this question. If one adds more virtues to the mix, one just gets more answers. Virtues, by themselves, cannot uniquely determine an answer to a question like this.

Here I would make a distinction. On the one hand there is the issue of whether thinking about the virtues can answer the question of what one should do on a particular occasion. On the other is the issue of whether the claim that a pattern of behavior (taking certain drugs) causes one to be a bad person with respect to a wide spectrum of character-traits (ranging from the capacity to delay gratification for the sake of long-range goals to the ability to form bonds of sympathy with others) -- whether this claim is a good enough reason to think that this pattern of behavior is morally wrong. About the former issue I think Lovering is quite right. Indeed, I think his little thought experiment makes this point rather neatly. But surely there is a wide logical gulf between agreeing with him about this issue and agreeing with him about the latter one, which is precisely the one that is being raised by the proponents of the degradation argument. About this issue Lovering's position seems to be (unless I am misreading him) that this claim, even if it is true, is simply not a good a good reason to think that this pattern of behavior is wrong. This seems to me massively implausible. It makes sense, at least to me, to say that one has a duty to become a better person, or at least to take reasonable steps to avoid becoming a worse one. This is most likely the idea that underlies the degradation argument, and it is not, as far as I can see, addressed by Lovering's attack on this argument.

To some extent, this seems to be forced on him by a feature of his general approach that I have so far not mentioned. He frequently responds to an argument by pointing out that drug use does "not always" or "not necessarily" have some allegedly wrong-making characteristic. It eventually becomes obvious that he thinks of his adversaries as those who think it is morally impermissible to ever, even once, use these drugs recreationally. It seems obvious that single instances of such behavior do not violate one's duty regarding effects on one's own character. This duty, as I have already suggested, is a matter of patterns of behavior, not of specific acts. (As is well known, this is part of the point of Kant's categorizing this duty, in the Metaphysics of Morals, as a duty of imperfect obligation.) By framing the issue as being about particular actions rather than patterns of action, we blind ourselves to the important question of the nature of this duty and its implication for some of the most important questions that are raised by drug use. It is true that Lovering does discuss patterns of behavior in his treatment of the "addiction argument" (pp. 111-121), but even there he seems to think that the issue before him is whether every case of recreational drug use results in addiction (see p. 120).

There is another assumption in this book that tends to bend it in the direction of irrelevance and sterility. Throughout the book, Lovering assumes, as I admit a great many contemporary moral philosophers do, a rigid and putatively clear distinction between moral arguments against doing something and prudential arguments. The drug issue seems to me one of the places where this artificial dichotomy tends to break down. After all, what seems to be driving the degradation argument? Isn't it a certain image of what the life of a habitual drug user is like? That life, in their view, is beneath the dignity of a human being. But what sort of an argument is an appeal to the idea of dignity? It seems to lack one of the essential characteristics of the moral (in the context of the moral/prudential dichotomy), which is necessary involvement with effects on people other than the agent. If my actions lack dignity -- another word that seems to belong here is self-respect -- that is not necessarily because of effects on others. Yet appeals to dignity do not seem to be prudential either: at any rate, they are not about whether my actions satisfy desires that I already have, apart from a connection with ego ideals that have the same ambiguity we find in the case of dignity and self-respect. They, too, do not seem to fit the moral/prudential dichotomy.

Finally, I would like to say a word about another somewhat vitiating assumption that I think it would be well to reexamine. This is the notion that the uses of psychoactive drugs that he is discussing here are "recreational." I think that framing the issue in this way gives too much to the anti-drug side of the debate. As I understand it, this notion is part of (another) dichotomous distinction: in this case, the idea that uses of such drugs are either medical or recreational. Your use of a psychoactive drug is medical if the drug was given to you by a doctor. All other uses are recreational. Of course there are many other uses. As Lovering points out a number of times, many people have used these drugs to aid artistic inspiration, and many others have used them as part of religious practice. Presumably, these uses do not come with the imprimatur of a doctor. Does he really want to concede that they are "recreational"? It is easy to see why the anti-drug side of the discussion would want to characterize them in this way: it trivializes the positive effects of such uses and makes it easier to argue that these effects are not worth whatever bad effects the drugs might have. Many destructive social effects have been blamed on drugs. If the only thing to be said in their favor is their "recreational" value, then these bad effects, if any of them are real, would seem to be weighty moral objections to participating the activities that cause them. Yet psychoactive drugs have long played a very complex array of positive roles in the human quest for a life that is worth living. To allow these many roles to be labelled "recreational" is to allow a crude oversimplification that arbitrarily favors one side of the debate.

If we were to right this wrong, it might open the way to a more positive ethical defense of non-medical drug use. They say that the best defense is an offense, and that seems as true here as elsewhere. As long as one's defense consists of trying to knock down all the objections that might be raised by the other side, something is lacking in one's defense. This is especially true if one does it mainly by playing the counterexample game we learned as students. The most convincing defense of a thing must show that there is something good about it. Many would say that such considerations are ethically irrelevant: there are merely prudential, where the prudential is conceived as a sort of garbage can into which the ethicist throws everything that does not fit one's notion of the moral.

It is possible, however, to conceive of the scope of ethical and moral considerations as much wider than this -- as it was conceived during at least the first two thousand years of the history of Western philosophy: Plato, Aristotle, the Stoics, the Epicureans, the Sceptics, and many of their successors thought that ethics is about the great question of how one should live one's life. What is the good life? If that is the question, then the moral defense of non-medical drug use can include a discussion of the positive contribution such use has made to human flourishing (along with an honest assessment of the damage). Of course, you might possess considered philosophical reasons for splitting the narrowly-conceived category of the moral off and focusing all your attention on that, more or less ignoring issues about human flourishing. In that case, you should be aware that the anti-drug side of the debate is not practicing this kind of logistical self-denial. They have ego-ideals in mind, and they are using them as rhetorical weapons, as is their right. You should also realize that the only really effective defense against an ego-ideal is a counter-ideal. If your opponent says that the conduct in question clashes with the best life for human beings, it is in a way beside the point to prove, in response, that it is morally permissible to do individual actions that clash with the best life for human beings. Such a response concedes too much territory to your opponent. The only hope of building an effective defense rests on the possibility of an attractive alternative vision of the best life for human beings.