A Moral Theory of Political Reconciliation

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Colleen Murphy, A Moral Theory of Political Reconciliation, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 214pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521193924.

Reviewed by Kendy M. Hess, College of the Holy Cross


In a world rife with civic failure, we've seen an increasing interest in the question of how to restore civic communities after they have failed. Much of that answer must come from the social sciences, of course, but philosophy has an important contribution to make: it can provide a normative theory of political community, one that outlines the characteristics of a good political community. Without such a theory, we have no basis for the claim that reconciliation is desirable in the first place and no way to evaluate whether proposed efforts toward political reconciliation are moving things in the right direction. Colleen Murphy's A Moral Theory of Political Reconciliation provides exactly such a theory.

A "good" political community, according to Murphy, is one in which "political relationships … express reciprocity and respect for moral agency" (28); political relationships will express this kind of reciprocity and respect when the community has three characteristics: (1) the rule of law is established; (2) political trust and trust-responsiveness are both justified and present; and (3) the citizens possess certain capabilities. The justification for this account is grounded in a very particular conception of moral agency, one rooted in both the Strawsonian focus on reactive and affective attitudes and the contemporary criticisms that "traditional" political theory fails to take seriously the emotional needs and experiences of human agents. Thus, Murphy's starting point -- and the fundamental justification for her entire theory -- is an account of moral agency defined largely in terms of affective experience and emotional capacities. As a result, the goal of political reconciliation is in large part to create a community in which the three characteristics obtain and the members feel certain things and are "moved" by certain considerations or experiences -- by empathy, identification, and trust (among other things). All of this is justified by appeals to the demands of reciprocity and "moral agency".

Taken as a whole, Murphy's Moral Theory is a nice addition to the literature. Her discussion of the analytic relationship between the rule of law and rational agency is illuminating (53-70), and her extensive analysis of the civic failures in Argentina, Northern Ireland, and especially South Africa is compelling. Best of all, she draws on capability theory and its supporting psychology to provide a fascinating account of how, precisely, various mechanisms of oppression (violence, economic oppression, and the inequitable construction of group identity) undermine both their victims and the political society in which they occur (103-130). For all that, however, I am concerned that Murphy relies so heavily on this "emotionalized" account of moral agency (though I acknowledge that such accounts are popular in some circles). Such accounts are unattractive for several reasons, not least because they blur the line between simple moral agency and the panoply of capacities and experiences that constitute our full "humanity", for lack of a better word. These are very different things, and I am concerned that in conflating the two, Murphy has availed herself of justifications that are no longer available to her. Once the discussion is recast as being about humanity (in this rich, concrete sense) rather than the simple abstraction of "moral agency", it is no longer clear that traditional assumptions about equality -- and hence about reciprocity -- really hold. As these provide the fundamental justifications for much of Murphy's account, this is worrisome.


Murphy presents an unapologetically ideal account of political community -- one which both expresses respect for and supports certain capacities of its citizens (what she has called "moral agency" and I have called "humanity") -- and the goal of political reconciliation is to bring this about. Such a community will have three essential characteristics. First, as explained in Chapter 1, the rule of law will be established. The rule of law is necessary because it supports the exercise of rational agency (by establishing a predictable environment within which to formulate and implement plans) and because it "expresses the moral values of reciprocity and respect for moral agency" (44, 49). When the rule of law is eroded, she says, the citizens experience resentment and loss of confidence (44).

Second, as explained in Chapter 2, political trust and trust-responsiveness will be both justified and present. This will be the case when (1) citizens and officials "feel optimistic" with respect to the competence, decency, and good will of their fellow citizens and officials, and when (2) citizens and officials are moved to be competent, decent, and good-willed by the trust felt by others (77-79). When this characteristic is not realized, the political relationships no longer express "the moral values of respect and a commitment to reciprocity" (81). Murphy insists that simply being trustworthy (reliable) is not sufficient; we must be moved to reliability by the fact that others are trusting us to fulfill this condition: "the reason to prove oneself reliable is because one is being relied on in a trusting manner … the trustee must prove trust-responsive by responding to the demands of trust itself" (90). Murphy ends this discussion with the further claim that trust and trust-responsiveness should be a default position. We should trust and be trust-responsive in the absence of justification to the contrary, because the failure to be presumptively trusting or trust-responsive is disrespectful of the other person's moral agency. "To demand that citizens or officials prove their decency or commitment to fair play … is normally fundamentally disrespectful, insulting, and calls out for justification" (82).

Third, as explained in Chapter 3, the members will possess certain capabilities, specifically

the capabilities of being respected; being recognized as a member of a political community; being an effective participant in the economic, social, and political life of the community; and fulfilling basic functionings that are necessary in order to survive and to escape poverty (95).

To have a capability is to have a genuine opportunity to achieve a specific valuable functioning -- to have a real chance to become someone who is respected, recognized, effective, and comfortable. Chapters 1-3 thus involve some relatively heavy philosophical lifting to present and justify each characteristic and to substantiate Murphy's claim that each supports and reinforces the others. Throughout, she draws heavily on real-world examples to illustrate her points and to support her claims about how, precisely, failures of law, trust, and capabilities lead to the erosion of political society. Her analysis of these examples is useful and compelling, and I fully expect to make some of it required reading in my classes that address social injustice. Her work here lays the groundwork for her later claim that true political reconciliation -- not just the absence of violence and upheaval but reconciliation -- requires the repair of precisely those three aspects of political society.

Chapters 4-6 address the practical implications of her claims. Chapter 4 considers the criteria that mark successful processes of reconciliation: they are either directly effective (at establishing or strengthening the three characteristics) or indirectly effective in that they encourage hope, acknowledge the need for repair, or help to establish the conditions that support the three characteristics. Again, she draws heavily on real-world examples to illustrate and support her claims, and the analysis here is one of the strongest parts of the book. Chapters 5 and 6 provide an interesting evaluation of the much-maligned truth commissions and international criminal trials, concluding that both have valuable (and legitimate) roles to play in the process of political reconciliation. However, she then criticizes the common assumption that the work of reconciliation is done once we've established a commission and held the trials. Instead, as she notes in the Conclusion, her account makes it clear that the real work has only just begun.


For myself, again, the most valuable contributions of A Moral Theory lie in its illuminating analyses of the real world situations in Argentina, Northern Ireland, and especially South Africa. I wish the book had been written later, so we could see similar analyses of Tunisia, Egypt, and especially Libya (at war as I write). For all that, as mentioned above, I have several concerns, two of which are discussed briefly below.

I am concerned about Murphy's reliance on what I've called an "emotionalized" account of moral agency. At its core, moral agency is simply the capacity -- and hence the obligation -- to recognize and respond to morally relevant considerations.[1] Anything that can do so is a moral agent bound by moral obligations; anything that cannot, is not. While it is certainly possible to give ever more elaborate accounts of moral agency, there seems little reason to do so. With every additional requirement we move further away from this essential core and create a larger universe of beings capable of responding to morally relevant considerations who are no longer recognized as obligated to do so. And Murphy's account (drawn largely from Shoemaker 2007) has a lot of extra requirements.

According to Murphy, moral agents must "possess a general capacity to enter into fundamentally interpersonal relationships with others", relationships which "are characterized by reactive attitudes, like resentment, gratitude, indignation, and love"; these attitudes "represent a way of holding others responsible for their actions" (146). It is also essential that moral agents recognize and apply second-personal reasons, acting on demands from others because they are demands from that other (146); that they be "susceptible to the emotional address of others", which requires the ability to "identify empathetically with others" (147); and that they "care" about others, experiencing "mature, complex emotions corresponding to the up-and-down fortunes of X" (147, quoting Shoemaker 2007, 83). All of this is necessary, she suggests, because

If an individual does not care about another, then she will not care about or be moved by the other's demands and emotional appeals. The other's demands "simply have no motivational grip on him." Nor will an individual be moved to understand how her actions have impacted the other person. (148, quoting Shoemaker 2007, 91)

But this seems untrue, unnecessary, and undesirable.

First, since only moral agents can have moral obligations, this suggests that an agent with impaired emotional capacities -- through depression, delusion, or some deeper incapacity -- is not a moral agent and thus is under no obligation to act respectfully or refrain from harm. Second, and more importantly, it explicitly denies the possibility of rational moral action. It denies our capacity to act on the basis of principle, to act respectfully or avoid harm because we believe it to be right -- to act as we believe morality demands not because of our emotions but regardless of our emotions (or the lack thereof). As the worlds each of us affects continue to expand, it is crucial that we insist on moral obligations that obtain in the total absence of emotional connection or engagement. It is false, and potentially dangerous, to claim that we lack that capacity or that its exercise is either optional or impossible. Finally, such accounts suggest -- although they certainly do not claim -- that there are no moral obligations in the absence of emotional connection ("empathic identification"). This is obviously an undesirable result and proponents would deny it, but I'm not entirely sure how they would successfully avoid it.

If my moral agency consists in my ability to form "fundamentally interpersonal relationships" with others, in my "susceptibility to their emotional address" and my emotional investment in their "up-and-down fortunes", then why would my moral obligations extend so far beyond the circle defined by those relationships and emotions? The connection between moral agency and moral obligations is often somewhat obscure, but there seem to be two obvious directions to go: either the exercise of the capacities establishes the obligations, or the obligations define the exercise of the capacities. Neither seems especially plausible. Taking the first direction yields the result that we have no obligations where we have not exercised these capacities, and our moral obligations are limited to those with whom we have caring and empathic relationships. That's obviously not a good outcome. Taking the second direction would require something like "caring about" -- not just "concerning ourselves with", or "acting caringly toward", but actually caring about and being emotionally invested in -- the well-being of potentially billions of total strangers. This seems implausible to the point of incoherence.[2]

As I've acknowledged, these "emotionalized" accounts are popular in some circles -- e.g., in the free will literature in discussions about "morally responsible agents", and in some feminist writings.[3] Those who are not put off by this approach in general are unlikely to be bothered by Murphy's use of it. But even for those who prefer this kind of approach it presents a potential problem here. This brings us to my second concern.

These accounts blur the line between simple moral agency (described above as the ability to act on the basis of morally relevant information) and the rich array of capacities and experiences that constitute our full humanity. A real human person is certainly a moral agent (usually), but she's also far more than that and her wants and needs are concomitantly greater. It takes far more to recognize and support her humanity than it does to recognize and support her moral agency, and it is entirely appropriate that political theories take this into account as Murphy has done. The difficulty is that once Murphy's discussion is recast as being about humanity, it is no longer clear that she is entitled to the traditional assumptions about equality -- and hence about reciprocity -- upon which she has relied throughout. For example, Murphy's (excellent) discussion of the rule of law draws heavily on Fuller's (1968) account, which in turn seems built around the abstract individual of traditional liberal theory. The actors in such accounts are all equal because they are abstractions, possessing only the capacities that people in fact have (more or less) equally: their rationality, autonomy, and freedom. Fuller's justifications for the rule of law are thus limited to supporting and respecting rational agency; the justifications can extend no further because the basis for the justifications extends no further. It is not obvious that the real, complex, human persons at the core of capabilities theory -- which Murphy says is "the same conception implicit in the frameworks of the rule of law and trust" (99) -- can be meaningfully described as "equal" in anything like the same way. It would be a serious difficulty for Murphy's account if the assumptions of equality -- and hence reciprocity -- that she has imported from traditional political theory do not hold.

Works Cited

Fuller, Lon. 1968. Anatomy of the Law. Westport: Greenwood Press Publishers.

McKenna, Michael. 2006. "Collective Responsibility and an Agent Meaning Theory." Midwest Studies in Philosophy 30: 16-34.

Shoemaker, David. 2007. "Moral Address, Moral Responsibility, and the Boundaries of the Moral Community", Ethics 118: 70-108.

[1] However defined, whether in terms of pain and pleasure, respect, rights and duties, excellence, etc.

[2] I am not denying the possibility that some people can in fact adopt such an attitude toward "billions of total strangers", or at least give it a good try. I am denying the coherence of the claim that we can have a moral obligation to feel this way, or for that matter, to feel any way at all.

[3] Though there, at least, the distinction between simple moral agents, persons, and the richer morally responsible agents is maintained -- see, e.g., McKenna 2006.