A Naïve Realist Theory of Colour

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Keith Allen, A Naïve Realist Theory of Colour, Oxford University Press, 2016, 204 pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198755364.

Reviewed by Hagit Benbaji, Ben-Gurion University of the Negev


The title of Keith Allen's fascinating book succinctly describes its content. The theory is realist because it holds that colors are mind-independent properties of physical objects. The theory is naïve because it holds that colors are distinct from any property identified by science. And it is a theory: notwithstanding any association with the adjective 'naïve,' this is the most systematic and developed account of colors as qualitative properties to date. Beyond the title, we are acquainted with qualitative properties through experience, so that the naïve realist theory of colors is coupled with a naïve realist theory of perception, in order to account for the autonomy of the manifest image. Yet, the manifest image does not "flow free" of the scientific image: colors and experiences supervene on physical properties. Granting pluralism of the manifest and scientific images, Allen's thought-provoking and engaging book ends with a promissory note: even the hard problem of consciousness disappears.

In more detail, the minimal commitments of naïve realism -- colors are mind independent (ch. 2-3) and distinct properties (ch. 4-6) -- constitute the core of the book. The argument for Mind-Independence and Distinctness has negative and positive strands. On the negative side, it involves eliminating the main alternative theories of colors: dispositionalism (ch. 2), relativism (ch. 3) and physicalism (ch. 4). On the positive side, Allen develops a non-Humean account of causal relation between color and the experience thereof, which replaces the mechanistic model of causation with the conception of a cause as making a difference (ch. 5). He then shows that only distinct properties, which cannot be identified by physical science, can essentially wear their structural properties, e.g., their similarity and difference relations, on their sleeves (ch. 6). Although naïve colors can reveal to us their structural properties, they are not fully revealed to us in experience (ch. 7). Indeed, one of the distinctive features of Allen's naïve realism is its liberation from the thesis that has practically become its hallmark, Revelation: "I know the colour perfectly and completely when I see it", as Russell famously put it. Having established the reality of naïve colors, Allen utilizes it as a case study for bigger questions such as the end of inquiry, and the meaningfulness of philosophical problems (ch. 8). By way of conclusion, he shows that anyone who does not want to accept qualitative properties on the surface of objects gets them as queer qualia inside the mind, thereby inventing a problem rather than solving one. On the other hand, acknowledging the reality of colors as-we-see-them, the manifest and scientific images can "both [be] accurate descriptions of different aspects of the physical world" (185), rather than relativized or competitive stories from different points of view (ch. 9). Thus, the naïve realist theory of color and experience holds the key to a proper understanding of mind and world.

Naïve realism is rooted in the Strawsonian tradition of descriptive metaphysics. Allen's theory goes against the grain, not the least for his unashamed stress of the need for a theory (contrast Campbell's "simple view of color"), but also because the theory is informed by empirical discoveries. In particular, he shows that scientific findings can help diffuse the notorious problem of color variation. Utilizing these findings, Allen rationalizes our preference for natural daylight, eliminating the threat of intra-personal variation (different colors due to difference in illumination for the same perceiver). He also shows that despite appearances to the contrary, scientific discoveries do not support the widespread belief in radical inter-personal variation (different colors due to difference of perceptual mechanism in different persons), even with regard to the famous unique green. Having said that, it should be clear that 'fidelity to experience' is not just another desideratum for Allen. The main motivation for adopting the theory is its promise to provide the best explanation and articulation of the phenomenology of experience.

While there is a variety of primitivist views by now, this is the first book-length treatment of such a theory (coming soon is Joshua Gert's). The book takes most of the familiar arguments, e.g., the modal argument, the argument from causal over-determination, and the argument from structure, some steps forward. More importantly, the book establishes a unique version of naïve realism. Primitivists claim that colors are the categorical ground of the disposition to cause experiences (Campbell 1993), 'Edenic' properties that are fully revealed in experience (McGinn 1996), or ways of modifying light such that it is characterized in terms of experiences (Broackes 1997). In all of these, experiences figure essentially in the account of what it is for an object to be colored. By contrast, Allen takes colors to be "ways of modifying an object's appearance," appearances being properties that objects manifest: "colours are that which grounds the patterns of appearance that objects manifest as the perceptual conditions vary" (113). In describing the nature of colors, then, there is no mention of experiences.

The view is also original in adopting moderate selectionism, according to which "physical objects instantiate a plurality of mind-independent colour properties that different perceivers, in virtue of differences in their perceptual systems, 'select' between" (66). Unlike current views that seek a unifying account of all types of color variation (e.g., relationalism, pluralism or realism), Allen's theory explains each type differently. Inter- and Intra- personal variation does not threaten the reality of coarse-grained color (red, green, and so on): a normal perceiver can see an object as remaining constantly red or green across a variety of illuminations (51), and normal perceivers usually converge on whether objects are red or green (61). As to the more fine-grained shades, we have seen that the fear of extensive variation in perception of unique hues is much exaggerated, and that natural daylight is privileged; thus, we can rely on it to determine the real shade of the object. The selectionism is, then, moderate: only inter-species variation (different colors due to difference of perceptual mechanism in different species) is explained by our capacity to select one color among many.

The book is rich in numerous original and subtle arguments. Let me focus here on the mind-independence of colors. I will raise some doubts about the very idea of the mind-independence of colors, the argument for it and its theoretical status.

Allen describes Mind-Independence as the claim that "colours do not depend for their nature and existence on our experience of them, and so there is an important distinction between the way they appear and the way they really are" (136). There seem to be two claims here. The first is that the nature of colors is independent of our experience of them. The second is that the existence of colors is independent of our experience of them. The second seems enough to imply the distinction between the way in which colors "appear and the way they really are." If colors can exist unperceived, they leave room for error and illusion, and thus, to the appearance-reality distinction. Apparently, Allen wants more: "To say that colours are mind-independent properties is not just to say that colour would exist if there were no perceivers around to see them. It is also to say, more fundamentally, that what it is to be a colour does not depend on the conscious experiences, or psychological responses more generally, of perceiving subjects: these responses are not even partly constitutive of the essential nature of the colours" (3).

What more do we require when we claim that the responses are not constitutive of "the essential nature" of the colors other than that they are not constitutive of, simply, the colors? It seems that if a color can exist unperceived, the responses, i.e. perceptions, are constitutive neither of the color nor of its essential nature (surely the strong requirement is not that the 'nature' of color can exist unperceived). The question is in what sense redness is more mind-independent than its existing unperceived.

The traditional conception of a primary quality whose nature can be described theoretically suggests such a sense. We can understand what it is for an object to have a primary quality not in terms of how it is perceived, e.g., we can say what it is for an object to be a square by describing it geometrically (having four right angles, etc.). My first concern is that if Allen takes colors to be mind-independent as shapes are, on the model of primary qualities, this is too strong a requirement. Colors, as Allen argues, are distinct properties, so that what it is for an object to be red cannot be described in theoretical terms of physical or geometrical sciences. Colors are, then, different from shapes in this respect. Further, as already noted, in explicating the nature of colors, reference to experiences seems to be inescapable (the categorical property or the way of modifying light has to be identified by reference to what they explain, namely, the experiences). Even Allen's account of colors as "ways of modifying an object's appearance" seems not to live up to the ideal of experience-independent description. Though appearances, e.g., the white car's appearing gray in the shadow, are properties of objects, it is not clear to me that we can conceive them without reference to experiences. What is it for a white car to be gray in the shadow, apart from its appearing gray in the shadow? And what is it for the white car to appear gray in the shadow, apart from its being such as to cause us experiences of grayness in the shadow? The concern is that experiences must figure in an account of colors as distinct properties, so that the mind-independence of color is exhausted in the appearance-reality distinction.

My second concern is that Allen's argument for Mind-Independence, the argument from constancy, seems to support only the appearance-reality distinction. Constancy is the phenomenon in which we perceive colors, like shapes, to remain constant across variations in perceptual conditions. Though turning on the desk lamp changes how the illuminated objects appear to us, they are not perceived to change their colors with the change in illumination (17). Allen emphasizes not only that the constant colors are perceived to persist through changes in illumination, but also that illumination "partly determines, grounds, or explains the way that an object's appearance varies as the conditions change" (19), and that only mind-independent properties can have this explanatory role. However, such explanation seems to require nothing more than the distinction between constant and changing appearances. Thus, the dispositional account, which takes redness to be mind-independent in a weaker sense than squareness is -- for redness is the object's disposition to appear red -- can distinguish, as Allen concedes, "dispositions to produce constant colour experiences as the conditions vary, in addition to dispositions to produce differing colour experiences as the conditions vary" (42). Hence, the conception of a constant property that explains its changing appearances does not call for mind-independence in the strong sense.

Allen's real issue with dispositionalism seems to turn on the claim that what it is like to perceive colour is 'inherited from' what the colours themselves are like. Allen argues that the dispositional account identifies the experiences independently of, and prior to, the colors (45). Thus, the experiences "could not inherit their phenomenal characters from that which they are experiences of" (44). However, granting that the disposition of the object to look red is a property whose existence is independent of any particular experience of it (as it leaves room for, e.g., the distinction between the constant and the changing appearances), the disposition can determine the content of each particular experience, even though the nature of the disposition is just to appear. It is unfortunate that such a non-reductive account of disposition is missing from the wide-ranging arsenal of theories presented in the book.

Let me end with Allen's intriguing suggestion that "the claim that colours are mind-independent properties is a theoretical claim, which is justified (if it is) on theoretical grounds (137-8)." It is somewhat odd that what constitutes the minimal commitment of naïve realism turns out to be a theoretical discovery. If our naïve conception of colors does not take them to be mind-independent, in what sense is a theory, the essential commitment of which is that colors are mind-independent, naïve?

Presumably, Allen thinks that what makes it naïve is that it is given to us in experience that colors are properties of physical objects. We see colors as properties of objects, though we are quietist vis-à-vis the mind-independence of colors (certainly Allen would not want us to be wrong about them, i.e., to conceive them as mind-dependent; that would involve an error theory). That is, we take redness to be a property of an object without having a clue as to what it is for the object to be red.

The third concern I raise is that the two claims -- colors are properties of objects and colors are mind-independent -- are conceptually too close to have a different epistemic status, so that one is a platitude while the other is theoretical. To conceive redness as a property of objects is, at least, to understand that the object can be red without being perceived as such, that is, to remain red at night, say. And one cannot acknowledge that an object is red at night, without knowing in virtue of what it can do so. In the case of colors, one has to grasp that perceiving the object as red requires not just its being red, but the meeting of further enabling conditions of perception, such as that the lighting is standard and that the color remains the same while its appearances change (constancy), etc. (Campbell 1993). This constitutes the core idea of the mind-independence of colors.

Why does Allen think that the claim that colors are mind-independent is theoretical? The first reason he gives is that "careful reflection on colour experience brings other philosophers, such as Berkeley, to the opposed verdict (that colors are mind-dependent and relational properties)." But Berkeley also denies that "colours are perceived to be properties of 'material' objects", and this claim does not lose its status as a truism. The fact that there is a philosophical controversy regarding our ordinary conception does not show that any verdict is bound to be theoretical. At most, it shows that descriptive metaphysics is not an easy thing to do.

Allen's second reason for the claim that Mind-Independence is theoretical is that its justification "goes beyond what is revealed to us in colour experience" (137). It includes, first, construing color experience broadly enough, and, second, not merely reporting on experience, but explaining, e.g., "the sense in which objects appear both the same (in some sense) and different (in some sense) as perceptual conditions vary" (137). However, broadening the scope of appearances on which we can reflect does not make reflection theoretical; it just brings in more experiences ("attending to the way that colours appear under different illuminants, comparing experiences of colour with experiences of properties like shape and size" 137). Even replacing 'reporting' with 'explaining' does not yield a theory. We 'explain' how we can perceive colors as being the same and different at the same time, when we say that the car in the shadow does not change its color, merely how it looks. That is, we explain what remains the same and what changes in terms of the difference between the color and how it appears.

This may be far from sufficient for a philosophical account of colors. Such an account must articulate the difference between real and apparent properties, rule out alternatives, etc. It has to be, in short, very similar to Allen's book, or at least to the relevant chapters. But it is one thing to claim that the philosophical argument for Mind-Independence goes beyond reflection on experience; it is another thing to claim that the conception of color as mind-independent goes beyond reflection on experience.

The same goes for the claim that the justification for Mind-Independence relies on empirical literature. Allen argues that "exactly what it means to exhibit perceptual constancy is controversial, and different interpretations can be motivated, in part, by considering the results of empirical investigations: for instance, by considering the way that colour constancy is explained by computational theories of vision, or the implications of asymmetric matching experiments. (137-8)." Again, in doing philosophy, we may have to rule out computational theories of constancy, as we rule out alternate philosophical views of constancy, or to explain away alleged implications of certain experiments. Allen does a great job in explaining why empirical findings, such as that "the best example of orange identified by one subject can be identified as the best example of yellow by another" (61), do not threaten the mind-independence of colors. But all this is consistent with insisting that the core conception of Mind-Independence is not held captive by scientific discovery. Let me emphasize that I am not trying to defend Revelation. Even if there are facts about the nature of color that can be revealed only by scientific inquiry (given Distinctness, though, why not take them to be about the physical basis of colors?), my point is merely to argue that the mind-independence of color, whatever it means, is not one of them.

These reservations exemplify the range of questions invoked in this extremely interesting book, from the nature of color and objectivity to the role of philosophy and science. It is an invaluable contribution to the literature on color and perception and highly recommended to anyone who is interested in the relation between mind and world.


Broackes, J. 1992. The Autonomy of Colour, in Reduction, Explanation, and Realism, D. Charles and K. Lennon (eds.), Clarendon Press: 421-65.

Campbell, J. 1993. The Simple View of Colour, in Reality, Representation, and Projection, J. Haldane and C. Wright (eds.), Oxford University Press: 257-68.

Gert, J. 2018. Primitive Colors, Oxford University Press.

McGinn, C. 1996. Another Look at Color, The Journal of Philosophy 93/11: 537-53.