A Natural History of Natural Theology: The Cognitive Science of Theology and Philosophy of Religion

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Helen De Cruz and Johan De Smedt, A Natural History of Natural Theology: The Cognitive Science of Theology and Philosophy of Religion, MIT Press, 2015, 246pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262028547.

Reviewed by Aku Visala, University of Helsinki


In the last couple of years, philosophers of religion have become increasingly interested in the biological and cognitive study of religion. For the most part, the debates have revolved around whether psychological knowledge about the cognitive mechanisms or the evolutionary history of religious thinking and behavior has any impact on the rationality of religious belief. This lively debate is connected to discussions about evolutionary debunking arguments in analytic epistemology and ethics[1] and has spilled over from journals to edited volumes, such as The Believing Primate: Scientific, Philosophical and Theological Reflections on the Origin of Religion (ed. Jeffrey Schloss and Michael Murray, Oxford University Press, 2009), Evolution and Religion and Cognitive Science (ed. Fraser Watts and Leon Turner, Oxford University Press, 2014), The Roots of Religion: Exploring the Cognitive Science of Religion (ed. Roger Trigg and Justin Barrett, Ashgate, 2014) and A New Science of Religion (ed. Gregory Dawes and James Maclaurin, Routledge, 2012). There are also several monographs in the market that engage with the bio-cognitive study of religion more comprehensively, not just discussing the rationality question: James van Slyke's The Cognitive Science of Religion (Ashgate, 2011) and my own Naturalism, Theism and the Cognitive Study of Religion: Religion Explained? (Ashgate, 2011). The former criticizes some of the basic assumptions of the cognitive science of religion and provides an alternative, more biologically driven approach. The latter focuses more on philosophy of science issues, discussing the nature of cognitive and evolutionary explanations and reduction while also including an overview of the debunking debate so far. Generally speaking, I find this interest in the bio-cognitive study of religion a welcomed development, because it pulls philosophers of religion down from their metaphysical musings towards relevant empirical findings.

The philosophical work on the bio-cognitive study of religion sometimes suffers from the philosophers' superficial knowledge of the relevant sciences. Similarly, when psychologists and anthropologists attempt to engage with philosophy of religion and theology, their lack of knowledge of the intricate discussions in those areas is clear. This is why I welcome Helen De Cruz and Johan De Smedt's book, which seeks to remedy this defect and, to my mind, succeeds in doing so. They aim to combine philosophical analysis of natural theological arguments with the empirical results of the cognitive sciences. More specifically, they want to argue that some premises of natural theological arguments are undergirded by intuitions produced by our cognitive systems, and this fact should be taken into account when these arguments' epistemic status is assessed.

Although the authors state that they want to focus on the cognitive origins of intuitions undergirding natural theological argumentation, the reader will quickly notice that they do present epistemic points about the arguments as well. Nevertheless, the subtitle of the book is somewhat misleading, because NHNT only deals with natural theological arguments and leaves most theology and other domains of philosophy of religion untouched.

One of the central merits of the book is that it appeals to two separate audiences that seldom read the same books. On the one hand, it is intended for philosophers and theologians interested in natural theology (or atheology). For them, it introduces a wide variety of relevant empirical findings and offers new perspectives into well-known arguments. On the other hand, for people working in the cognitive science of religion, it will function as an introduction to the philosophical debates and open up new avenues of empirical research. This interdisciplinary style is in line with contemporary experimental philosophy, which (among other things) seeks to empirically examine the various everyday intuitions that often drive philosophical debates on a wide variety of topics. In this sense, NHNT is not "just" philosophy of religion but has a much larger appeal. Again, bringing the more empirically driven attitude of experimental philosophy to philosophy of religion is of great value to the whole discipline.

NHTN consists of nine chapters. The first two provide brief overviews of the history of natural theology and the cognitive science of religion (CSR) respectively. CSR is an interdisciplinary field combining developmental, cognitive and evolutionary psychology, as well as biology and anthropology, and it studies the basic mechanisms of religious beliefs and behaviors. The three main claims of CSR are as follows: (a) religious beliefs and practices are products of normal human cognition so there is no specifically "religious cognition"; (b) religion is not just a cultural artifact, but has it roots partly in pan-human cognition that constrains religious expression; (c) the human mind is composed of a number of basic cognitive mechanisms, or modules, that operate somewhat independently of one another. The basic idea behind claim (c) is that human cognition houses sets of "core knowledge" or "intuitive knowledge" like intuitive physics, biology and psychology that function as cognitive defaults and operate without the need for extensive reflective processing. Religious thoughts and behaviors utilize these basic core intuitions, especially folk psychology, or so CSR says.

The third chapter focuses on intuitions undergirding reasoning about divine attributes, mostly omniscience, and describes various empirical studies of the development of god-concepts in children. The rest of the chapters are devoted to natural theological arguments. The arguments discussed include the usual suspects along with some fresh faces: the cosmological argument, the teleological argument, the moral argument, the argument from beauty and the argument from miracles.

De Cruz and De Smedt take what they call a moderately naturalistic approach. While not assuming either theism or metaphysical naturalism, they argue that a strict distinction between causes and reason cannot be maintained. Since arguments and reasons are products of our ordinary cognitive systems, empirical knowledge about the origins of our reasons and the intuitions supporting them can help us to evaluate philosophical arguments. Nevertheless, they state very clearly that no knowledge of the causal history of an intuition can by itself decide whether some argument works or not. Indeed, the final chapter of NHNT offers reflections on how empirical knowledge ought to (or ought not to) have effect on the plausibility of the arguments themselves.

I will not go on to explain in any detail the content of the individual chapters. Instead, I will simply mention some discussions so that the reader will get a rudimentary idea of the approach. Consider cosmological arguments. Cognitively speaking, they invoke intuitions about causes and effects. Humans have a tendency to implicitly assume that all events have causes and that individual things have causal explanations for their emergence. Furthermore, humans have a tendency to attribute agents as causes of events and other effects that, say, exhibit design more than some other events. Such intuitions feature prominently in cosmological arguments, especially those that utilize the principle of sufficient reason.

On the one hand, it might be the case that applying causal reasoning to the existence of the world as a whole will not work, because "the world as a whole" is not sufficiently analogous to ordinary things and events. This was Hume's criticism of the argument. On the other hand, Hume's idea of how causal cognition works and what causes are was rather superficial compared to what we know through cognitive psychology. Causal reasoning does not consist of simple generalizations on the basis of observed regularities. Current knowledge suggests that humans can easily and naturally postulate specific, invisible causes for new kinds of events and intuitively assume that individuals do indeed have something like "causal powers" and liabilities.

De Cruz and De Smedt suggest that basic causal cognition works successfully and naturally in everyday life, which makes the causal principle prima facie plausible in other domains like science and metaphysics as well. If the prima facie reliability of causal cognition and the causal principle were denied, we would face the problem of collateral damage and might end up rejecting everyday and scientific causal reasoning as a result. Whether we think that the causal principle can be extended to "the world" as a whole has more to do with our general metaphysical view rather than our basic intuitions. Furthermore, our views about the plausibility of theism and atheism also have an impact as to what we consider to be the relevant explananda in the first place. Thus, De Cruz and De Smedt maintain that cosmological arguments, like all other natural theological arguments they review, cannot be discredited simply because they invoke cognitively natural intuitions. We cannot judge the reliability of the intuitions on a metaphysically neutral ground: our views about the plausibility of theism and atheism have a significant role in the epistemic analysis. This is why the authors suggest that we should not draw strong conclusions regarding the plausibility of natural theological arguments on the grounds that they are to some extent undergirded by our intuitive, core knowledge.

There are several enlightening discussions that are genuine contributions to the field. Let me mention just a few. The first has to do with the development of God-concepts in children. Traditional wisdom is the anthropomorphism hypothesis, according to which children arrive at god-concepts by extrapolation from everyday person-concepts. Against this, some representatives of CSR have argued that children intuitively think about all persons as having super-attributes, like super-knowledge and superpower. In other words, it is cognitively more efficient to process other agents as if they had access to all relevant information, for example. Modeling cognitive limitations takes a lot of cognitive processing, so children under four or five have difficulties in representing false beliefs of other people, or so the argument goes. So in the case of religion, it is actually quite natural for children to think that gods know everything. In the literature, this is known as the preparedness hypothesis. The debate between anthropomorphism and preparedness has been fierce. After reviewing the relevant empirical findings, De Cruz and De Smedt end up suggesting a more nuanced picture. There are two distinct systems in intuitive psychology: one is slow and flexible favoring unlimited agents, and another, faster and more inflexible driving our reasoning towards limited agents. This means that we cannot generalize as to whether omniscience or super-knowledge as an attribute is clearly intuitive or counterintuitive.

Second, NHNT extensively discusses the argument from beauty and aesthetic experience. In contemporary discussions, this argument has received very little attention compared to, say, the teleological argument and the cosmological argument, so it is rather refreshing that De Cruz and De Smedt have included it here. The chapter also critically summarizes the various hypotheses about the evolution of aesthetic emotions and judgments very succinctly.

Third, NHNT makes a contribution to the debate by clearly distinguishing internalist and externalist responses to debunking worries. At least in philosophy of religion, the debate has so far been conducted in the context of reliabilist and externalist epistemologies. This can be seen in many early essays (especially those in the aforementioned The Believing Primate). For these views, the issue of the reliability of basic cognitive mechanisms is the key for warrant. From a more internalist and evidentialist perspective, the debunking problem looks different: for the evidentialist, the justification of a belief is based on the internally accessible reasons for the belief, not directly on the causal origins of the belief. In most of the literature so far, this distinction has not been clearly recognized, whereas De Cruz and De Smedt draw the distinction consistently throughout the book.[2]

At this point, I will present some critical points about the terms "natural" and "naturalness". NHNT takes onboard the standard definition of "naturalness" coming from cognitive science and CSR. On this view, some types of information are easier to process than others. More specifically, the more a cognitive process exhibits automaticity, context independence and independence from cultural learning, the more it is considered natural. In his book Why Religion Is Natural and Science Is Not (Oxford University Press, 2012), Robert McCauley distinguishes maturationally natural cognition from practiced naturalness. Practiced naturalness also exhibits automaticity but requires "cultural scaffolding" and intentional instruction. In this sense, riding a bike or writing are parts of practiced natural cognition. Maturationally natural cognition does not need such scaffolding or instruction but happens automatically, as when children learn their native language.

Although this way of thinking about naturalness is not uncommon, it is by no means uncontroversial. This is mainly due to the problem of innateness, highlighted by several philosophers of psychology and biology. It seems rather difficult to specify, say, what "independence from cultural learning" or from "cultural scaffolding" comes down to exactly without drawing unwarranted distinctions between genetic causation, learning and culture.[3] Furthermore, doubts about innateness (and naturalness in general) also undermine the idea that cognition is indeed deeply or massive modular in its architecture. This is the aforementioned claim (c) of CSR, namely, the "Swiss army knife" model where cognition is understood as a collection of specialized systems that develop quite uniformly across cultures. If it is the case that innateness is a problematic notion, it becomes increasingly difficult to maintain that individual modules and the resulting domains of core knowledge are genetically specified and their development is panhuman or somehow independent of cultural influence. I am not saying that it is the job of NHNT to defend the basic assumptions of CSR in this regard. Nevertheless, I would have expected a bit more critical reflection on such questions especially since they are crucial for the plausibility of the standard model of CSR of a whole.

Finally, it seems that the central merit of the book might also be its weakness. Since NHNT balances between philosophy of religion and cognitive science, it might end up leaving representatives of both domains somewhat disappointed. Philosophically, the book aims to cover an enormous amount of ground so it is understandable that those who are previously well versed in the debates about natural theological arguments will not find many new philosophical insights. Similarly, psychologists and others who are up to date with the empirical findings might not learn anything new from NHNT. Nevertheless, for philosophers and theologians who want to understand and engage with new empirical research on religion and wonder about its implications for philosophy of religion, there is no better book than The Natural History of Natural Theology.

[1] E.g., Guy Kahane 2011, "Evolutionary debunking arguments", in Nous 45, 103-125; Sharon Street 2006, "A Darwinian dilemma for realist theories of value", in Philosophical Studies 127, 109-166; Richard Joyce 2006, The Evolution of Morality. Cambridge: MIT Press. 

[2] For one attempt to develop an internalist and evidentialist response to debunking arguments, see Jonathan Jong and Aku Visala 2014 "Evolutionary debunking arguments against theism reconsidered", in International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 76, 243-258.

[3] E.g., Richard Samuels 2007 "Is Innateness a Confused Notion?", in Foundations and the Future, Vol. 3 of The Innate Mind, ed. Peter Carruthers, Stephen Laurence, and Stephen Stich, Oxford: Oxford University Press; Matteo Mameli and Patrick Bateson 2011, "An Evaluation of the Concept of Innateness", in Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society B 366, 436-43.