A Naturalistic Epistemology: Selected Papers

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Hilary Kornblith, A Naturalistic Epistemology: Selected Papers, Oxford University Press, 2014, 222pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198712459.

Reviewed by Alvin I. Goldman, Rutgers University


Hilary Kornblith, one of the leading proponents of naturalistic epistemology, has authored a multitude of articles and books on epistemology generally and naturalistic epistemology in particular. Thirteen of his articles are now collected in this volume. They range across a wide variety of topics, including foundationalism, coherentism, reliabilism, internalism versus externalism, and epistemic normativity. But his defense of epistemological naturalism is what gives the volume its title and its unifying thread, as clearly indicated in the Introduction (p. 3). In light of limited space, therefore, this review focuses on central methodological debates between naturalists and anti-naturalists, on the one hand, and between radical and conservative naturalists (as Kornblith classifies them) on the other. Because those topics are dealt with most directly and thoroughly in two papers in the volume, "Naturalism and Intuitions" and "Knowledge in Humans and Other Animals," they will be the focal points of this review.

At the beginning of "Naturalism and Intuitions,"[1] Kornblith pinpoints the debate over the role of intuitions in philosophy as the central one that separates naturalists from anti-naturalists. Defense of the method of intuition in philosophy (what George Bealer calls the "standard justificatory procedure") is crucial to the anti-naturalist worldview. But Kornblith also assigns certain self-styled naturalists to this category. Although these "conservative" or "moderate" naturalists may, for example, appeal to cognitive science to probe and assess the standard justificatory procedure, thereby introducing science at least at the "meta-level" of analytical methodology, Kornblith argues against attempts to "have it both ways". He seeks a "purer" form of naturalism, and doubts that any attempt at "unification" between the standard justificatory practice and appeals to scientific inquiry is going to work (p. 166).

Kornblith's conservative naturalist is someone who takes the object of philosophical analysis to be concepts. This is a point of particular concern for Kornblith. On his view the target of philosophical analysis should not be anyone's concept; instead it should be the category that the concept is a concept of.

Philosophers, on this view, seek to understand knowledge, for example, not anyone's concept of it. Some concepts will more nearly get the phenomenon right than others, so not all concepts are equally good guides to the phenomenon, but our concepts are merely the vehicles by way of which we might come to understand the extra-mental phenomena, not the targets of our researches themselves. . . . since our ultimate target is the extra-mental phenomenon on this view, we would do better to study those extra-mental phenomena directly (pp. 166-67).

But is it really so clear that the ultimate target of philosophical analysis is, or should be, an extra-mental phenomenon? And can all relevant philosophical activity be directed exclusively toward such phenomena, without any intermediate step of probing subjects to obtain their classification judgments (or intuitions) with respect to possible cases? In my view, the proposal to restrict the epistemological project to an empirical investigation of "extra-mental phenomena" faces three serious problems. I will first characterize the problems and then give some examples.

First, there are some possible targets of philosophical inquiry to which there is no corresponding extra-mental phenomenon, nothing that could be investigated by empirical observation. Second, there will often be many candidates (indeed, a horde of candidates) for the status of extra-mental phenomenon, that is, different extensions that one might wish to investigate. How should the philosopher select the appropriate target for empirical investigation? Third, does Kornblith mean to suggest that all targets of philosophical investigation are natural kinds? That doesn't seem to fit with the rather constraining features of natural kinds (under his preferred construal of them). If some philosophically appropriate targets are not natural kinds, how is the scientific project of investigation supposed to proceed?

To begin with the first problem, consider possible targets of philosophical analysis where there is no extra-mental phenomenon, where the concept has no referent or denotatum in the actual world. How is the philosopher/scientist supposed to proceed? A simple example is "unicorn." Can't one conduct a philosophical analysis of what it is to be a unicorn? Might philosophers not seek such an analysis, although it is impossible to substitute an empirical inquiry into an extra-mental phenomenon? (There is nothing to observe.) Although philosophers have never shown any interest in "analyzing" what a unicorn is, wouldn't this be a perfectly respectable request? And under the concepts approach to philosophical analysis, it could readily be undertaken. But since there are no unicorns, there is no extra-mental phenomenon (in the actual world) that the term designates; so there is nothing out there to be observed scientifically in the hope of fixing a relevant natural kind.

Second, for a given analysandum, there will often be multiple candidates for being the relevant extra-mental phenomenon. If we set out to study knowledge empirically, as Kornblith instructs us, we will have an excess of candidate extra-mental phenomena. Starting with Kornblith's preferred candidate, there is the set of states that consist in a creature believing a true proposition as a result of using a reliable process. Second, there is the set of states that consist in a creature believing something true (period). Third, there is the set of states consisting in a creature believing a proposition justifiedly (without its being true). Finally, there is a host of additional candidates, each corresponding to a different theory that was floated in response to the Gettier problem. Which of these many candidate extra-mental phenomena should philosophers of knowledge seek to investigate empirically? And how should they choose the one that is really knowledge?

What emerges here is that the epistemologist would need some prior method for choosing the right extra-mental phenomenon. And it seems inevitable that the method for making this choice will have to be something like the traditional one of consulting speakers' judgments about which states qualify -- "intuitively" -- as states of knowing. In short, a prior method is needed to pick out which set of extra-mental events in the world should be the target of a Kornblithian empirical investigation. Without such a prior method, the epistemologist would be like a blind man sent on a mission without a guide, or guide dog, to help him. Without a guide, how can one select the relevant extra-mental phenomenon? But Kornblith seems intent on denying the epistemologist any such guide.

The third problem is really a series of questions. Does Kornblith think that for every term or concept of epistemological interest there corresponds a natural kind? And does this generalize to other branches of philosophy? Kornblith endorses and uses Richard Boyd's characterization of natural kinds as "homeostatically clustered properties which are mutually supporting and reinforcing in the face of external change." Does he mean to suggest that all analysanda of probable interest to philosophers have corresponding natural kinds (in this sense)? Does "explanation," for example, qualify as a natural kind (in Boyd's sense)? If not, what does Kornblith's approach instruct us to do? Must epistemologists remain silent about the concepts of justified belief, rationality, and evidence? Is there nothing informative for epistemology to say about any epistemic term that lacks a natural-kind counterpart (in the actual world)? Accepting this verdict would severely restrict the field, greatly reducing its scope and power. That certainly seems undesirable.

However, Kornblith does have some ammunition for undercutting the standard practice of conceptual analysis.

[In the standard approach to philosophical analysis] it is taken for granted that the form of a proper analysis is just some . . . set of individually necessary and jointly sufficient conditions. The idea that our concepts are mentally represented in this form is what psychologists refer to as the Classical View of concepts. Since the early to mid-1970s, it has become increasingly clear that the Classical View is not correct. Some of the most important problems of the Classical View are due to the discovery of typicality effects. (p. 171)

Here he proceeds to expound major findings in psychology about typicality effects, in which certain individuals that are positive instances of a category (e.g., "birds") are more typical of the category than other positive instances. Robins and sparrows, for example, are regarded as more typical birds than ostriches or penguins, although all of them are recognized as birds. Kornblith sees no way that this feature of our concepts can be rendered compatible with the standard approach to philosophical analysis.

Although I concede that philosophers have not refined their approach to philosophical analysis so as to incorporate this feature of our psychology into its practice, I see no problem in principle here. There should be ways to incorporate into the structure of concepts a weighting scheme that assigns different "strengths" to different properties. Cognitive science can and should be used to improve the kind of investigations that traditional philosophers engage in. However, as far as I can see, this would not imply a thorough debunking or abandonment of methods that use hypothetical examples and intuitive classifications thereof. (Indeed, the finding of typicality effects relied on just such intuitive classifications.)

I turn now to the paper "Knowledge in Humans and Other Animals." The first part is an early statement of Kornblith's view that the category of knowledge is a natural kind. Such kinds can be studied empirically, and indeed this is just what cognitive ethologists do when they study knowledge in animals. As previously indicated, Kornblith encourages this kind of study as a replacement for traditional philosophical analysis. However, Kornblith anticipates the response from any number of philosophers that human knowledge differs in kind from animal knowledge, because of its self-reflective character. According to Laurence BonJour, for example, a belief is justified (hence a candidate for knowledge) only if it is a product of reflection upon the extent to which it coheres with the believer's entire corpus of beliefs. Surely this isn't something that animals can do; so there wouldn't be any animal knowledge on BonJour's anti-naturalist approach.

A way out of this dilemma is to hold (with Ernest Sosa, for example) that there are two distinct kinds of knowledge: animal knowledge and human knowledge. The fundamental feature that distinguishes the two is self-reflection, an activity of which only humans are capable. Kornblith is unimpressed with this approach, in part because it sets the standards for human knowledge too high, as BonJour's position indicates. Kornblith thinks that there is no need to draw such a distinction. He argues that the cognitive ethologists' kind of knowledge -- true belief, which is the product of a reliable process -- in no way excludes reflection; it merely does not require it (for knowledge). Finally, Kornblith argues that human knowledge is not different "in kind" from the knowledge that other animals enjoy. "Knowledge seems to be a single natural kind." (p. 133)

In this territory a moderate naturalist can cheerfully agree with Kornblith. What is crucial is that philosophers should not attempt to draw fundamental divisions between humans and animals "from the armchair." Cognitive science must be consulted (and taken seriously). Both radical and moderate naturalists should be happy to agree on this. Let me give two illustrations of what (various strands of) cognitive science might say about the relation between human and animal cognition, some of which is relevant to the issue of self-reflection in humans.

Philosophers tend to assume that sophisticated or advanced cognition is conscious cognition. Higher-order reflection (assumed to be conscious) therefore strikes them as a good candidate for a special kind of cognition that is distinctive to humans. But this rests on some very questionable presuppositions, which face challenges from current scientific thinking. The most popular approach to perception nowadays is the Bayesian approach, according to which perceptual systems, e.g., vision, operate in accord with Bayesian principles, ostensibly an advanced and sophisticated form of cognition. Yet these perceptual processes are entirely absent from consciousness, at least until their outputs are generated. (See Rescorla 2013 for an exposition of the principal ideas.) Second, this use of Bayesian mechanisms in perception is not confined to humans. It is said to be found in many species of animals, including common marmosets (a small monkey). In one study Cheng et al. (2007) report how diverse species make spatial judgments based on multiple cues, where the integration of the several information sources is performed by Bayesian principles. There is no reason here to think that human perception is dramatically superior to perception by the relevant non-human species. So, this seems to be an arena in which, by certain criteria of sophistication, animal cognition is as sophisticated as human cognition. And this sophistication involves no dependence on either conscious awareness or higher order reflection.

My second illustration provides greater potential support for a contrast between animal and human cognition. There is a popular (though possibly over-hyped) approach to human cognition called "dual-process theory," which postulates two rather different processing systems in the human mind. (See Evans and Frankish, 2009; Kahneman, 2011). According to this approach, System 1 is responsible for processes that are (i) evolutionarily old, (ii) unconscious or preconscious, (iii) shared with animals, (iv) automatic, (v) fast, (vi) intuitive, and (vii) associative. System 2 is responsible for processes that are, by contrast, (i) evolutionarily recent, (ii) conscious, (iii) uniquely human, (iv) controlled, (v) slow, (vi) reflective, and (vii) rule based. Some of these contrasts suggest that there may be a uniquely human set of processes (System 2) that underpin reflective thought and is not found in animals.

This is not the place to provide specifics about either of the preceding large topics. The point is simply to illustrate how cognitive science actively develops accounts of cognition that are highly relevant to epistemology, but require much finer tools of inquiry than those available in the armchair. So, as all types of epistemological naturalists insist, there are reasons to exploit such material wherever relevant. But this doesn't require an abandonment of all traditional methods.

As always Kornblith is a pleasure to read, in terms of both liveliness and forthrightness of argumentation. These are among the factors, no doubt, that explain the impact of his writing. He is also a bold thinker; and while some might find him too bold for their taste, I feel that philosophy can use more boldness than it usually gets. Boldness promotes diversity, and diversity is generally good for communities, ecosystems, and academic disciplines.


Cheng, K., Shettleworth, S.J., Huttenlocher, J. and Rieser, J.J. (2007). "Bayesian Integration of Spatial Information," Psychological Bulletin 133(4): 625-37.

Frankish, K. and Evans, J. St. B.T. (2009). "The Duality of Mind: An Historical Perspective," in J. St. B.T. Evans and K. Frankish (eds.), In Two Minds: Dual Processes and Beyond (pp. 1-29). Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Goldman, A.I. (2010/2012). "Philosophical Naturalism and Intuitional Methodology," The Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 84(2): 115-150. Reprinted in A.I. Goldman (2012), Reliabilism and Contemporary Epistemology: Essays (pp. 280-316). New York: Oxford University Press.

Kahneman, D. (2011). Thinking, Fast and Slow. New York: Farrar, Straus and Giroux.

Rescorla, M. (2013). "Bayesian Perceptual Psychology," in M. Matthen (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of the Philosophy of Psychology. Oxford University Press.

[1] As Kornblith explains in the Introduction, this paper “presents a critical discussion of Alvin Goldman’s [this reviewer’s] defense of an armchair approach to philosophical questions.”  Given that the paper was published in 2007, before certain of my more thorough treatments of the armchair method appeared, some characterizations of my view are out of date.  This includes the unqualified statement that I take philosophical analysis to concern mental concepts.  However, this is not the place to focus on this issue.  (For a more up-to-date statement, see Goldman 2010/2012).  Thus, the review will treat Kornblith’s criticism as directed against a typical naturalist of the “conservative” or “moderate” variety.