A New German Idealism: Hegel, Žižek, and Dialectical Materialism

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Adrian Johnston, A New German Idealism: Hegel, Žižek, and Dialectical Materialism, Columbia University Press, 2018, 376pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231183949.

Reviewed by Robert B. Pippin, University of Chicago


The current book by Adrian Johnston continues his extensive engagement with the work of Slavoj Žižek, and so with the question of a proper statement of a contemporary "dialectical materialism," an issue that for both of them hangs on a proper reading of Hegel's theoretical work. Johnston's book Žižek's Ontology (2008) dealt with Žižek's work up until The Parallax View (2006). His Badious, Žižek, and Political Transformations: The Cadence of Change (2009) deals with Žižek up until In Defense of Lost Causes (2008). The current volume deals predominantly with two works; a work Johnston often refers to as Žižek's chef d'ouevre or masterpiece, Less Than Nothing: Hegel and the Shadow of Dialectical Materialism (2012), and its subsequent restatement and reformulation, Absolute Recoil: Toward a New Foundation of Dialectical Materialism (2014).

On the one hand, the topic of the current book is formulated in a way that would seem to be preaching to a small and select choir, whoever is worried about "Which comes first, the positivity of contingent material facticity or the negativity of a primordial Void. Schematically speaking, I defend the former option, while Žižek defends the latter." (p.xi) On the other hand, the engagement with Hegel raises a number of important philosophical issues much in the philosophical news, from the cogency of modern versions of naturalism and materialisms to the proper critique now needed of what is at this point a depressingly totalized, triumphant global capitalism. And there are several crucial issues of Hegel interpretation involved. However, the approach taken in the book limits it in other ways. It is relentlessly self-referential and self-promoting ("Žižek and I" is a constant refrain), often self-congratulatory, and frequently quite polemical, at times to the point of agitprop. "Anything short of this reckoning [Johnston's own position] signals a disrespectful underestimation throwing the doors wide open to a surreptitious replacement of Hegel with a dummy made for exploitation by post-Hegelian ventriloquists." (p.73) (Full disclosure: I am the main target of the chapter that concludes with this swipe. More to come below.) Much of the polemic sounds like an intra-party squabble about purity (as in, "who is the true dialectical materialist"). Positions are "betrayed" (p.129); there are charges of unacceptable backsliding, slippage from the right position (p.147) and there is an unfortunate sectarian cast to the whole enterprise. (Žižek's work, by contrast, is refreshingly free of these characteristics.) Johnston seems to want mostly to call Žižek back to his better self, to offer an "internal critique" that states the Žižekian position more clearly than some of Žižek's own formulations.

The main issue that unites Johnston and Žižek is the extraordinary claim that Hegel's Absolute Idealism is actually, when properly understood, "dialectical materialism," and, indeed, precisely the version modern critical theory now requires (that is, not the "historical materialism" of left-Hegelianism).[1] The materialism that results is not a reference to the putatively harmonious, fully rational, and in principle fully intelligible nature of Newtonian mechanics but a combination in some way of late psychoanalytic theory (the self-negation at the heart of Hegel is for Žižek a manifestation of Freud's death drive), Lacan, and the results of quantum physics and even string theory (or at least what are by now Sunday magazine summaries of such bodies of knowledge.) Their main disagreement (there are several minor ones) is what is expressed telegraphically in the passage quoted above. Johnston wants Hegel's philosophy of nature to have pride of place in dialectical materialism. He thinks Žižek focuses too much on the Logic and is too wedded to a Schellingian claim that the subject-object distinction (or the distinction between spontaneous subjectivity or freedom, and nature or natural determinism) can be neither a subjective nor objective distinction, and so must be some sort of "void," or "abyss," not even a "nothing" but "less than nothing." Or in other Hegelian terms, the substance-subject split is not a dualism per se; it is the self-diremption of substance, its "recoil" from itself. This is not a prioritization of substance because it is the gap, the split, the neither-one-nor-the-other that counts as the Hegelian Absolute. These are extraordinarily abstract terms and we stay pretty much at this level of abstraction throughout the book. After a short Preface reminding the reader of Žižek's understanding of the Verstand-Vernunft (understanding-reason) distinction (no abandonment of the former in moving to the latter but a working through of the former to reveal what it was unknowingly committed to all along), and an introductory first chapter, there are four more chapters and a long conclusion on drive and desire. The Introduction (1) discusses the problem of freedom and system in German philosophy. The chapters then discuss (2) the errors of the supposedly deflationist, subjective idealist, Kantian reading of Hegel that Johnston ascribes, quite inaccurately, to me; (3) the problem of contingency in Hegel's system; (4) What Johnston calls "materialism sans materialism" in Žižek; (5) German Idealism, biology and compatibilism, and then a Conclusion on the "(Meta)-dialectics of drive and desire."

The first, introductory chapter will be familiar to anyone who knows the history of the growing dissatisfaction with what could be called reason's sufficiency unto itself, or the absoluteness and autonomy of pure apperceptive thought, in Kant and, so it was assumed, in Hegel, a moment of dissatisfaction already visible in Hölderlin's 1795 fragment "Urtheil und Seyn." The activity of thinking must, it was argued, have some "ground" in some sort of pre- or non-thought, what is prior to or a basis of thinking, out of which or in terms of which its activity can be accounted for. Empirically unaided, reflective pure thinking cannot be wholly self-positing as it is paradigmatically in Fichte, but also in Kant (the first Critique is wholly reason's critique of itself) and in Hegel's Logic (which for Johnston, should be understood to be equiprimordial with the Philosophies of Nature and Sprit, not that on which the latter essentially depend (p.75)). This of course is also part of the problem of understanding systematically the spontaneity necessary for freedom with the causal necessity of nature. If it is a result of thought's self-reflection that we are unavoidably committed to both positions, then we must have an ontology, an account of the real, in which both commitments could make sense. Johnston explains Žižek's dissatisfactions with Kant's two-world solution, and what he proposes as his own suggestion in the following formulation. It resonates with the summary above.

Žižek, both in Less than Nothing and throughout his corpus, relentlessly pursues investigations regarding how being qua being must be thoroughly reconceptualized in light of the facts both that it sunders itself into the parallax split between subjectivity and objectivity and that subjective reflectivity or reflexivity continues to remain immanent, although nonetheless irreducible to it. (p.29)

Or, what are gaps in our knowledge in Kant are "ontologized" by Žižek's reading of Hegel; they are gaps in being. This sort of thing is a frequent refrain in the book (see p.61, 144, inter alia; and "the gap (that separates us from the Thing) as the Real" (p.190))[2] and I was constantly puzzled by it. If being "sunders itself" just ends up meaning: we must deal with the fact that being includes subjects and objects, the world just comes this way, it has somehow resulted in this duality, then we are simply still faced with all our problems. (How could subjects know objects? How could subjects move objects, including a subject's body, around? How could objects be conscious? If these are illusory problems wrongly formulated, as I think Hegel believes, the sundering event does not help us understand why.) If "sunders itself" is supposed to explain something, what accounts for the sundering and how does the sundering event help us understand this "immanence" but not "reducibility" (isn't that the old problem just restated?), and how would that help with these problems? Simply saying: nothing accounts for it; it, the sundering event, is pure contingency (a frequent refrain too; it all arises out of the void), is certainly a conversation stopper, but it does not seem philosophically helpful. The same sort of thing is said of the "gap" between the factual and the normative. All is supposed to be solved when we realize that the gap "is immanent to the factual itself." (p.45) There are some positions which hold that the normative is "immanent" in the "factual"; Aristotle's, for example, if we want to put it that way. But the whole point there is: there is no gap. How does it do any philosophical work simply to assert that the gap is immanent to the factual?

More serious problems emerge in Chapter Two. Johnston wants to criticize what he calls "deflationary" accounts of Hegel, which he characterizes as nonmetaphysical readings. He names a number of figures but the main culprit is yours truly. The chapter as a whole laboriously and repetitiously undertakes to show that Hegel was not Kant, was not a subjective but an absolute idealist, did not revert to trying to specify the categories necessary for the finite subject's experiencing the world, but had a metaphysical project, the goal of which was a robust account of being qua being. I am supposed to have replaced "absolute with subjective idealism wholesale." (p.59) None of this has anything whatsoever to do with the position I have attributed to Hegel for almost thirty years now. To restate the obvious: First, the only metaphysics Hegel wants to abandon is rationalist dogmatic metaphysics. (Johnston seems to understand this much.) No nonsensible noetic objects knowable by pure reason alone. No souls, immaterial minds, creator God, no res cogitans, no monads, Platonic Ideas, etc. Hegel frequently celebrates Kant's destruction of such an enterprise ("thing metaphysics," or the metaphysics of the "beyond").[3] But of course Hegel has his own "metaphysics," and its closest analogue is Aristotle, not Leibniz or Spinoza or Plotinus. Besides, any moderately awake person reading Hegel on Kant from the Differenzschrift onwards would not need to be reminded so tiresomely that Hegel, despite his frequently expressed profound admiration for Kant, completely rejects what he regards as Kant's subjective idealism. Johnston does not even mention Hegel's central concern, what he rightly understood to be the subjectivizing element in Kant's idealism, the pure subjective forms of intuition. And that is a telling point. Again, it is does not need to be pointed out to anyone that Hegel asserts "the identity of thought and being." But this has two primary dimensions. One concerns the "logical" determinations of anything at all, specified by pure thinking's dialectical self-determination in the Logic. But Hegel also wants to address directly Kant's concerns with the role of pure concepts in everything from perceptual experience to the interpretation of art works. He wants to insist that, while a conceptual and sensible element are distinguishable in perceptual experience, they are not separable. There is no two-step, or "imposition" application of concepts to an exogenous material. Perceptual experience is conceptual "all the way down." But the obvious fact that Hegel is concerned with correcting Kant on this issue should never be taken to mean that his "idealism" wholly consists in a theory about the subjective conditions for the possibility of experience. This is just what Johnston has done, and it is a gross distortion. It is beyond me why Johnston thinks he needs to spend so many pages belaboring the stunningly obvious point that Hegel is not a subjective idealist.

In the Logic, anyone interested in Hegel's theoretical philosophy must take on board several indisputable Hegelian principles, none of which I see present in Johnston's summaries. The Science of Logic is said to be "the science of pure thinking." Pure thinking is not (in the Logic, as opposed to the Philosophy of Subjective Spirit) a mental event, or a subjective activity. It is pure thinking's inquiry into what is necessary for pure thinking to be possible, whatever or whoever is thinking. In just that sense, it is a logic. Pure thinking is understood as primarily judging, the truth bearer of all knowledge. Thinking is exclusively discursive, not intuitive, in no sense a perceptual power. It is pure activity; a productive power, and, as Hegel says over and over, it produces its own content. The object of pure thinking, he insists, is itself. Thinking, judging, is apperceptive; in any thinking or judging, such judging is reflective; judging is, is not accompanied by, consciousness of judging. It is this feature that allows thinking's self-determination, in "producing" its "Denkbestimmungen," thought determinations or moments (Quantity, Quality, Relation and Modality, for example) to be simultaneously aware of what it has determined and whether it exhausts what is required for thinking to be a truth-bearer. With all this in play, Hegel insists unequivocally that only "now," after Kant, logic is metaphysics.[4]

Again, none of this is a claim about how the mind actually operates. If that were the case, and Hegel were making a claim about the mind's nature, knowledge would be limited by its "instrument," something Hegel had been vigorously denying since the Introduction to the Phenomenology. In knowing itself, what pure thought knows is the possible intelligibility, the knowability, of anything that is. But the intelligibility of anything is just what it is to be that thing, to be determinately "this-such" (tode ti), the answer to the "what is it" (ti esti) question definitive of metaphysics since Aristotle. So in knowing itself, thought knows of all things, what it is to be anything. Again, as for Aristotle, the task of metaphysics is not to say of any particular thing what it is. It is to determine what must be true of anything at all (what in scholasticism were called the transcendentalia), such that what it is in particular can be determined by the special sciences. Or: it is to know what is necessarily presupposed in any such specification. (Of course the Physics and the De Anima are also philosophical sciences for Aristotle, but Hegel will have a Philosophy of Nature and a Philosophy of Spirit, too.)

None of this is in the slightest deflationary. On the contrary, it is a robust insistence on the possibility of pure thinking, philosophy, with substantive results about the nature of determinacy, finitude, essence, appearance, substance, causality, teleology, life. And it has absolutely nothing to do with "subjective idealism." I go on at such length because of Johnston's dismissive talk about a "dummy" Hegel and a "phony" Hegelianism. This Hegel, as just formulated, is of course wide open to several sorts of objections, but the position needs to be stated properly and carefully before that begins.

Chapter Three fares a little better but ends up again both reciting the obvious and deeply confused. It fares a little better because Johnston is on the side of the angels in insisting that Hegel is not a wild necessitarian. He does not think that the existence of every object in the cosmos and the happening of every event is necessary, could not have been otherwise; nor does he think that every event in human history unfolds with necessity as the actualization of a fixed potentiality. §6 in the Encyclopedia Logic settles that issue. As Johnston rightly points out, Dieter Henrich long ago showed that Hegel insisted on what could be called the "necessity of contingency," that there could not be a coherently intelligible world (or free action) were there not contingent events. But Johnston follows Žižek in also insisting on the "contingency of necessity" and that is a much more obscure claim. Understood one way, it is also trivially true. Once something contingent occurs, many other possible events are necessarily precluded, and only some possibilities are entailed. But this is then inflated into a claim that is deeply obscure, at least to me.

Any necessity (whether formal, real or absolute) is a subsequent result arising from or supervening on a prior contingency -- specifically a merely possible actuality just so happening to also enjoy being-there/existence. (p.108)

This is then glossed with a quotation from Žižek.

Hegel is . . . the ultimate thinker of autopoesis, of the process of the emergence of necessary features out of chaotic contingency, the thinker of contingency's gradual self-organization, of the gradual rise of order out of chaos. (Ibid.)

And so we return again to the ultimate contingency, the self-sundering of being, the gap, the void, and so forth. And this results in a world "as autojustifying and self-supporting (that is with a base of grounded necessity) but at the same time, also 'without why' (ohne Warum) as unjustified and unsupported (that is, with a baselessness of groundless contingency)." (p.109) I lost the thread somewhere along the way to this extraordinary claim. It seems to me "grounded," given some prior actuality, but ungrounded in that the prior actuality is absolutely contingent and so ungrounded. But if this means: if Boyle's gas law is a law of nature then the relation it claims exist between pressure and volume is a necessary relation; but it is contingent that there are gases at all, contingent that there is a cosmos at all, then this hardly makes the necessity "contingent."

When Johnston tries to gloss what this "Ur-contingency" amounts to, he suggests we think of the entanglement of all thought with natural languages. Sapience is possible only in language. Languages are riddled with contingencies. Therefore "cognitive intelligence cannot avoid entanglement with and working through incarnations of the modality of contingency." (p.88) Again, this is ether trivially true, or, if inflated into a Big Point, unconvincing. It would be like arguing that any actual notation expressing a well-formed formula in logic or a valid proof is contingent (Polish notation, truth trees, standard quantificational notation, red ink, blue paper, whatever). Therefore logic itself, what is contingently expressed, is entangled in contingency. No, it isn't, not in any significant logical sense. The proof is not contingently valid.

This (the discussion of the priority of contingency) all leads Johnston to disagree that a proper dialectical materialism cannot be said to have any predictive power, as Žižek claims. (For him, making sense of historical events is necessarily retrospective.) Johnston claims that if Žižek were to pay more attention to Hegel's Realphilosophie, he would see that there is some predictive power in Hegel's approach; for example, that modern capitalism "will, at the hands of the rabble, commit suicide in the not-too-distant future." (p.119) That is news to me, and I have no idea how to evaluate such a disagreement. Perhaps we will simply have to wait and see.

On the issue of the "priority" of the Logic in Hegel's system: although the equiprimordiality of all three parts of the Encyclopedia is of crucial importance to Johnston and the source of many of his criticisms of Žižek, Johnston, astonishingly, demurs at giving any reading of what Hegel actually says at the end of the Logic about the transition to the Realphilosophie. (He says he does not know if it "works" or "does not work" and that it is all a "matter of some confusion and dissension among his readers." (p.143)) But this does not make him hesitate in his criticisms of Žižek on Hegel or in his own assertions about Hegel. Hegel himself, in the Introduction of the Philosophy of Nature, described what he is doing as investigating the "self-determination" of the concept in the "thinking" relation to nature, first of all in physics [in seiner eigenen, immanenten Notwendigkeit nach der Selbstbestimmung des Begriffs ]. And that "The determination and the purpose of the philosophy of nature is therefore that spirit should find its own essence, its counterpart, i.e. the Concept, within nature." [5] I can't see how any of that is consistent with what Johnston asserts, and it is quite surprising that for all his celebration of Hegel's Philosophy of Nature, he never deals with any of it, apparently considering all of it out of date. That section of the Encyclopedia seems to function for him only as a title.

Chapter Four expresses solidarity with Žižek's attempt to understand a form of materialism that avoids crude reductionism, an antiquated conception of matter, and any notion of nature that is a "Whole organically at one with itself and its parts." (p.137) We want a conception of nature that is "desubstantialized qua conflicted, disharmonious, inconsistent, and so on" (p.138) ("Mind the gap" might be a suitable subtitle for all of Žižek's oeuvre.) But we also want to avoid a "hyperstructuralist ontology of strong formalism" (the Badiou option which Johnston thinks Žižek is too tempted by) as well as any "Deleuze-inspired 'new materialisms,'" panpsychic and mystical, as well as Žižek's alternate temptation to "the negative theology" of the void. (p.147) Johnston thinks all this leads us to a conception of what he calls "weak or rotten nature." At this point the jargon and metaphorical character of the account ("rotten"?) becomes so internal to Žižekiana and Johnston himself that I can't imagine it all being of interest to or even accessible to non-Žižek-specialists.

The "internal critique" of Žižek becomes even more deeply internal in the concluding two chapters, one on a naturalist compatibilism and one on drive and desire. The main point of Chapter Five is to present a sympathetic portrait of Žižek's position on compatibilism, summarizing a somewhat unwieldly borrowing from Kant (Henry Allison's Kant) and German idealism (here more Fichte and Schelling than Hegel, although the latter's notion of retroactivity in action plays a crucial role), Lacan, modern neurobiological research (Libet), quantum physics and some resources of modern anglophone philosophy (Dennett). This essentially involves a reanimation of the core of modern compatibilism (in Hobbes, for example), with "all the freedom worth wanting" as the absence of external constraint, but supplemented with psychoanalytically inspired psychological detail and the metaphysical position we have seen several times before. Ultimately, Johnston's point is mildly critical, that Žižek "so far, has yet to stipulate what the sufficient conditions, in addition to the necessary ones, are for the genesis of subjectivity out of substantiality." Nevertheless, he has laid out "solid foundations for future intellectual labors along these lines." (p.152)

The concluding chapter begins with a discussion of "Hegel's Extimacy: The Nondialectical Ground of Dialectics" and dives into an extended discussion of the Lacanian distinction between desire and drive. Some of the dialectical twists are predictable by now. Where Kant gave us the duality between rationality and animality and so an infinite and unsatisfiable striving for moral satisfaction, requiring the postulate of immortality, Žižek insists that for Hegel this irreconcilable divide is already "goodness itself, goodness incarnate." (p.192) (Even Johnston admits that this is "debatable" as Hegel interpretation.) Human animals become human not by liberating themselves from natural confinement and developing distinctly human capacities (which is the way Hegel actually talks most often)[6] but by "passing through a concentration into the more, rather than less, rudimentary (that is, the repetitive, the narrow, the habitual, the fixed, the driven, and so on.)" (p.195) How this would help us understand how human beings justify themselves to each other when their actions impede what others would otherwise be able to do is not clear to me. The process of grading Žižek on his Žižekianism continues throughout, supplemented now by long quotations from what Johnston has written before about psychoanalysis, Jonathan Lear, the pleasure principle and the value of returning to Freud for a kind of post-Žižekian engagement with the origin.

A final comment. At one point, Johnston quotes an apt remark from a letter by Althusser, that "Hegel . . . remains, after all, the fundamental reference for everyone, since he is himself such a 'continent' that it takes practically a whole lifetime to come to know him well." (p.80) That is certainly true, but it is also true that Hegel cannot be "known well" at all if one's survey of his work is from such a high altitude that one ends up trading in catch phrases, jargon, arbitrary interventions in and citations from isolated texts, repetitive formulae, and so a sectarian appropriation of a great thinker for a kind of internal party politics. To return to Johnston's image, in that case we end up with a ventriloquist's dummy.

[1] Lukács is the representative figure of historical materialism. p.133

[2] Quoted by Johnston from Žižek's Less than Nothing, p.496

[3] See is The Encyclopedia Logic. Transl. T.F. Geraets, W.A. Suchting, H.S. Harris. (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 1991), §41A; Lectures on the History of Philosophy in Three Volumes, transl. S Haldane and F. Simson (London: Kegan Paul, 1896), 424; The Science of Logic, by George di Giovanni (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010); 21.29; 21.48; 12.194

[4] "Thus logic coincides with metaphysics, with the science of things grasped in thoughts, which used to be taken to express the essentialities of the things." Encyclopedia Logic, §24.

[5] G.W.F. Hegel, Werke, ed. E. Moldenhauer and K. Michel. (Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1970-1), vol. 9, §246

[6] Hegels Philosophie des subjektiven Geistes/Hegel' s Philosophy of Subjective Spirit, 3 vols., ed. and trans. M. Petry (Dordrecht: Riedel, 1978), I: 6-7. See especially

Art by means of its representations, while remaining within the sensuous sphere, liberates man at the same time from the power of sensuousness. Of course we may often hear favorite phraseology about man's duty to remain in immediate unity with nature; but such unity, in its abstraction, is purely and simply rudeness and ferocity, and by dissolving this unity for man, art lifts him with gentle hands out of and above imprisonment in nature. (G.W.F. Hegel, Aesthetics: Lectures on Fine Art. Translated by T. M. Knox. 2 vols. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975), 1:49.)