A Perfect Moral Storm: The Ethical Tragedy of Climate Change

Placeholder book cover

Stephen M. Gardiner, A Perfect Moral Storm: The Ethical Tragedy of Climate Change, Oxford University Press, 2011, 489pp. $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195379440.

Reviewed by Holmes Rolston, III, Colorado State University


This is a radical book, both in the sense that it faces extremes and in the sense that it goes to the roots (Greek: radix). "We are currently accelerating hard into the most serious environmental problem that humanity has ever faced" (p. x). "My thesis is this. The peculiar features of the climate change problem pose substantial obstacles to our ability to make the hard choices necessary to address it" (p. 22). "The dominant discourses about the nature of the climate threat are scientific and economic. But the deepest challenge is ethical" (p. xii). "There is no one to properly hold us accountable" and when "important values are articulated … the likelihood of their perversion is high" (pp. xii-xiii). The result is a perfect moral storm -- utter or consummate because of a joining of serious storms that ratchets up their individualized disruptiveness.

Gardiner's challenge is to make sense of a tragic mess at global scales, one with impending disaster. This is something like doing ethics during a hurricane, only this natural disaster has anthropocentric causes. There are three main upsetting currents in the storm (p. 7):

1. Asymmetry of power, between the rich and the poor. The richer nations, which have contributed most to the storm, have the most power to do something in solution, but tend to act in ways that favor their own self-interests. The poorer nations, and the poorer within those nations, who have contributed least and have no power to act, have the most to suffer.

2. Asymmetry of power, between the present and the future. Present generations can affect the prospects of future generations adversely, but not vice versa. There is no reciprocity, so no bargaining, no checks and balances. Gardiner calls this a "tyranny of the contemporary." Here democracy is as much the problem as the solution. People vote for politicians who give them what they want now. Gardiner calls this a "tyranny of the majority."

3. A lack of robust ethical theories capable of dealing with such a consummate storm:

Even our best moral and political theories are poorly placed to deal with many of the issues characteristic of long-term global problems such as climate change. These include (but are not limited to) intergenerational equity, international justice, scientific uncertainty, persons whose existence and preferences are contingent on the choices we make, and the human relationship to animals and the rest of nature" (pp. 213-4).

Utilitarians, for example, tell us to do what is best, but this inevitably involves considerable cost-benefit analysis, and, alas, such costs and benefits are impossible to estimate reliably. There are too many uncertainties and ignorances about climate change. We can reliably know there is disaster ahead, but cannot metricize the figures, nor distribute them to the differing peoples on whom the costs and benefits will fall. There is "cost-benefit paralysis" (p. 247).

All this is prone to facilitate moral corruption (Chapter 9). Even in everyday moral thinking, we readily rationalize. Gardiner uses a memorable example from Jane Austen's Sense and Sensibility to illustrate how the well-intended can lose their resolve. Our thinking is easily manipulated. We talk ourselves out of it, or let others (with vested interests in the outcome) talk us out of it. We argue away inconvenient duties. If that is a feature of common life, the challenge of an ethical response to global climate change takes it to a pitch. "The arguments that succeed are likely to trade on deep forms of corruption, and perhaps involve some form of moral schizophrenia" (p. 339). To some extent our behaviors causing climate change are misdirected because they are self-interested. But such behaviors may not be even intelligently self-interested, just shallow or stupid.

Upsetting the climate upsets everything: air, water, soils, forests, fauna and flora, ocean currents, shorelines, agriculture, property values, international relations, because it is a systemic upset to the elemental givens on Earth. The storm is absolute, comprehensive, inclusive, ultimate; there is an unprecedented convergence of complexities, natural and technological uncertainties, global and local interactions, difficult choices scientifically, ethically, politically, socially. There are differing cross-cultural perspectives on a common heritage. There are intergenerational issues, distributional issues, concerns about merit, justice, benevolence, about voluntary and involuntary risk. There is a long lag time, from decades to hundreds of years. Surely but gradually, local goods cumulate into global bads. There are opportunities for denial, procrastination, self-deception, hypocrisy, free-riding, cheating, and corruption. Individual and national self-interest is at odds with collective global interests.

There is fragmented agency; six billion persons differentially contribute to degrading a common resource, the atmosphere, all persons equally depending on climate, but with radically different powers to affect it. Even in the powerful nations, there is a sense of powerlessness. What can only one do? Any sacrifice I make (paying more for wind power) is more likely to benefit some overuser (heating his trophy home), than it is to better the commons. Institutional, corporate, and political structures force frameworks of environmentally disruptive behavior on individuals (such as high use of cars), and yet at the same time individuals support and demand these frameworks as sources of their good life (they love their SUVs).

The global character makes an effective response difficult. Some global environmental problems can be solved by appeals to national self-interest, where international agreements serve such national interests. But the damage needs to be evident or the results in immediate prospect -- such as with over-fishing agreements, whaling, the Law of the Sea, the Convention on Trade in Endangered Species, or the Montreal Protocol on ozone depleting hydrocarbons. Global warming is too diffuse to get into such focus.

Generally the developed nations are responsible for global warming, since they emit most of the carbon dioxide. Although global warming affects rich and poor, generally the poorer nations are likely to suffer the most. These nations may have semi-arid landscapes or low shorelines. Their citizen farmers may live more directly tied to their immediate landscapes. Being poor, they are the least able to protect themselves. They are in no position to force the developed nations to make effective response, particularly with effects on future generations or their or any other landscapes.

We are smarter than ever, so smart that we are faced with overshoot. Our power to make changes exceeds our power to predict the results, exceeds our power to control even those adverse results we may foresee. Where mitigating action is possible (such as limiting emissions), the present generation may bear costs while the benefits are gained by future generations. Postponing action will push much heavier costs onto those future generations; prevention is nearly always cheaper than cleanup. But the preventers live in a different generation from those who must cleanup. Classically, parents and grandparents do care about what they leave to children and grandchildren. But this intergenerational inheritance is not so local. Americans gain today; who pays the costs when, nobody knows.

Gardiner considers geoengineering -- but this is "geoengineering in an atmosphere of evil" (Chapter 10, p. 339). That way of phrasing it may seem stern, but at least this is geoengineering (even if by the well-intended) by those who have to choose the least evil atmosphere, trying to fix a degenerating one. One evil little considered by the geoengineers is what their engineering does to the nonhuman world. In fact, although Gardiner does deal with the effects on the nonhuman natural world, which he calls "the ecological storm" (pp. 43-4), he does not do so adequately.

This is a bleak book. I suspect (and fear) that a principal conclusion of readers will be that any effective solution is hopeless. So we welcome Gardiner's closing thoughts on meeting the challenge: "how to muddle through even in the absence of a guiding 'grand theory'," some "initial ethics for the transition" (pp. 399-400).

Gardiner hopes that we can act together with at least these convictions: "Ethical concerns are already at the basis of international climate policy." Nobody denies that these issues are deeply ethical. "Scientific uncertainty does not justify inaction." One ought to take certain actions just because of the uncertainty. "Precaution is theoretically respectable." One can be overly cautious, but when the stakes and uncertainties are high, one ought to take much caution. "Past emissions matter." Polluters should pay. "The intergenerational burdens should fall predominantly on the developed countries." "Specific intergenerational trajectories require ethical defense." We ought to set targets for emission reductions, and argue for them not only scientifically but ethically. "The right to self-defense is an important but sharply limited rationale." "Individuals bear some responsibility for humanity's failure." (pp. 401-403)

This is a discursive and thorough analysis and reveals both Gardiner's concern with his topic and his keenly analytic mind. A book of this size (nearly 500 pages) is not likely to be read cover to cover by one reader in 500 -- especially when readers begin to get the feeling that it is repetitive. There are frequent anticipations and summaries. We get some tips about which parts can be read (and skipped) for what purposes. Fortunately the book does not have to be read thoroughly to have profound impact.

Will it have such impact? Gardiner rings the changes on the subtleties of arguments. One conclusion is the excellence of Gardiner's careful analyses, but another is that no understanding of these subtleties is ever likely to drive actual political decision making. Those in the drivers' seats have no time, energy, effort, or even capacity to absorb such arguments; and if they did, they could not persuade others in the legislatures and businesses where they operate. They will grab a few arguments that suit their purposes and ignore the rest. Where philosophy ought to be most useful, in clarifying the terms of public debate, it seems likely to be of no real help at all. Cleaning up the mess by analysis promises to offer power for driving solutions, but such power never operates where the rubber hits the road. The storm goes on.