A Philosopher Looks at Digital Communication

A Philosopher Looks At Digital Communication 2

Onora O’Neill, A Philosopher Looks at Digital Communication, Cambridge University Press, 2022, 150pp., $12.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781108986816.

Reviewed by Mathias Risse, Harvard University


Published by Cambridge University Press, the A-Philosopher-Looks-At-Series has philosophers explore phenomena that are of broad interest and do so in a way that reflects both the authors’ philosophical outlook and their personal interests. Digital technology has revolutionized the way we communicate, for better and for worse—and so digital communication is clearly a suitable subject for this series. Onora O’Neill has not only built a distinguished career in philosophy but has done so as an astute observer of human affairs. So she is an immensely suitable author to offer her thoughts on this subject. The book’s main achievements are taking stock of the vexing features of digital communication (that the ease with which digital content can be copied and sent around all by itself makes it hard to track its originators and equally hard for originators to limit their messages to a particular audience, and that the digital communications infrastructure we have built makes all that even harder) and pointing out that we do have tools to analyze and address this situation, but then also arguing that the tools that most readily capture the spirit of the times will not suffice to do so. So altogether, the reader comes away with an appreciation of the magnitude of the task that is upon us in this domain. One feature of O’Neill’s earlier work that resurfaces here is her skepticism of the human-rights apparatus and its effectiveness in capturing comprehensive ethical norms—a point she now applies to digital communication. The book is well-written and easily accessible to anyone interested in taking a step back from the everyday drill of digital communication. O’Neill is well-versed in the relevant literature, which is nonetheless integrated only as needed (which means that scholarly debates do not hamper the flow much).

It’s a peculiar time to be writing about digital communication. On the one hand, particular versions of digital communication driven by machine-learning algorithms (and thus by what is commonly called Artificial Intelligence) have been making enormous strides in the last decade or so and are in fact entering something like their own industrial age as we speak. Influential computer scientists have started to assert that the kind of communication such software is capable of is getting ever closer to the communication of sophisticated human agents. On the other hand, our times are characterized to a large extent by fear and concerns about what further digitalization might bring. Gone are the days of straightforward optimism about the generically democratizing and broadly empowering potential of anything related to the World Wide Web, and of industry slogans that emphasize the desirability of radical and abrupt change, such as Zuckerberg’s “move fast and break things.” (To be sure, much of the tech industry seems still driven by such a mentality, but its public acceptance has fallen considerably in recent years—and so such slogans are less broadly advertised than they used to be.) But digital communication is here to stay, and so we need to try as hard as we can to get it right.

O’Neill puts digital communication in the broader context of communication as it has unfolded over the millennia. Before the invention of scripts, human communication was largely oral. O’Neill reminds us that Socrates worried about the deceptive and unreliable nature of written as opposed to oral communication. Once written down, Socrates argues in the Phaedrus, words might “roam around” because their originator cannot be interrogated about their meaning. Belonging to a largely oral culture, Socrates did not write anything, and Plato wrote dialogues, mimicking orality. But writing increasingly became part of culture. Initially writing was about preserving thoughts that were considered worth keeping for centuries and about record-keeping for political purposes.

This kind of writing was limited to rather small parts of the population (and most people did not have the reading skills needed to participate in these practices). But later, the invention of the printing press not only made it easier to include broader segments of the population in written cultures, it also made it easier to share thoughts that were not considered to be as important as what used to be written down in earlier periods. Over the course of time, mechanisms evolved to keep producers of texts accountable and to prevent the use of written texts from inflicting damage in society. Printers and publishers were tasked with maintaining certain standards. Among those who did the writing, a particular group stood out that since the late 18th century was often called “the Fourth Estate”: professional journalists and other writers shaping public opinion who were powerful and important enough to be honored with this label, but who also could normally become individually influential only by being identifiable. In other words, written cultures developed standards of accountability.

Such standards are much harder to develop in the digital age. It is a hallmark of digital technology that content can be stored, copied, and spread at great speed. It is now much easier for the written word to “roam around,” presumably beyond Socrates’s wildest imagination. O’Neill’s discussion captures how much of a struggle it is to create standards of accountability in the digital age—not only because the written word can roam so fast, but also because so many people can contribute perspectives via online media such as Twitter or Facebook. Connectivity has its virtues, to be sure—but it has also brought together those people who almost took down American democracy on January 6, 2021 (of whom many were convinced that they were in Washington to save democracy). There still are professional journalists, of course, but referring to them as “the Fourth Estate” no longer makes much sense. The magnitude of this change is enormous, and it has only occurred in this century. Different parts of the world have different ways of dealing with this new situation, but it is worth taking a step back and standing in awe of what has been happening in our communications landscape—which then also gives us a sense of how much more work there is to be done to have reliable ways of implementing acceptable standards.

The standards themselves, O’Neill suggests, are ancient and remain much the same even across oral and written cultures. Ethical norms for communication include respect for evidence, consistence, coherence, accuracy, truth, and comprehensibility. We value honesty, civility, courtesy, discretion, moderation, openness, tact, tolerance, and trustworthiness. On the flipside, communication is likely seen to be ethically defective if it involves lying, perjury, deception, defamation, fraud, cheating, bullying, intimidation, and so on.  But the good is much harder to come by, and the bad much harder to avoid, if senders and recipients are not readily identifiable. One of O’Neill’s main messages is that we must strive to make sure that at least the people who shape communication are identifiable and thus accountable.

One feature of the way we have arranged our digital communications is that many people avail themselves of technological platforms free of service fees—but instead accept that their data factor into a vast pool of information used to direct advertisements and other messages aimed at getting people to do certain things. As Zuckerberg famously explained in response to a question about Facebook’s business model during Congressional hearings in 2018: “Senator, we run ads.” To the extent that social media are important components of the public sphere, and to the extent that the platforms on which views are exchanged let people use them for free but then make money by selling data to third-parties who accordingly are the real consumers of such platforms, our public sphere is in fact outsourced to the highest bidder. And in many cases these highest bidders remain unknown.

To be sure, users often give their consent to their data being deployed in such ways, and so one might say this is not much of an issue. But one feature of our digital lives is that we interact with plenty of platforms, and engage in plenty of activities on these platforms that involve the taking of data. Much as it has been said of socialism that it takes too many evenings, the same (and more) would be true of the actual study of declarations of consent. Empowering users is an important goal, but—and here O’Neill is simply right—we would be kidding ourselves if we thought that cultivating practices of consent-giving were a credible goal in light of the digital complexities all around us. Similarly, we would be kidding ourselves if we thought that unlimited access to ever more information and to an ever-broader range of viewpoints is plainly a good, or that increases in digital literacy (as important as that is) could even hope to come close to putting us in a position to deal with the digital revolution that is unfolding all around us.

O’Neill has long been a sceptic of the human rights movement, and of tendencies to reduce ethics to the assertion of rights. In this book she brings this point to bear on digital communication. She points out that before the 20th century, duties were much more central to ethics, as both philosophers and citizens understood it. But then people’s willingness to ask what their duty was made it too easy for them to become coopted when the power of modern states was unleashed to subdue other parts of the world. So, the language of rights became more prominent, especially that of human rights, and made people ask more about what they were entitled to and what provisions they deserved than what they ought to do. While O’Neill does not of course advocate for a return to the earlier use of duty-talk, her long-standing criticism is that too much is indeed lost if ethics is reduced to rights-talk.

As far as digital communication is concerned, human rights address freedom of expression and privacy. But as we have already noted, we also value honesty, civility, courtesy, discretion, moderation, openness, tact, tolerance, and trustworthiness when it comes to communication, digital or otherwise. These are not matters the human rights movement covers, at least not very directly, nor are they even the kind of thing that is best understood in terms of particular demands individuals can make. Instead, these are standards that should be respected because acceptance of such duties makes agents into the kind of persons they have good reason to be and because it makes the social world a certain way.

As far as human rights are concerned, I would agree that more talk about duties or, in any event, responsibility is necessary—but would add that, once that much is understood, much of O’Neill’s criticism of rights generally and human rights in particular would be addressed. And that, I would think, is also very much in the spirit of the historical account she offers. Overstretched and misused duty-talk engendered a rights-based response, and the 21st century is a good period during which we might want to think about how to bring these two domains of ethics back together in plausible ways.

There’s more topics one could have covered as a philosopher looking at digital communication. One of them is deepfake technology, which might soon create a situation where video can no longer function as the kind of epistemic backstop that it has been in contested cases over the last few decades—which in turn, among many other things, might undermine possibilities of trust among citizens in democracies. Another is the ways in which digital technologies make contemporary cultures oral cultures in larger ways than they have been since Martin Luther became the first world champion of the printing press. Not only are images and videos everywhere, but the spoken word becomes ever more important through digital assistants like Alexa, so much so that many parents have started to worry about their children questioning why they (the children) should communicate in writing in quite the way their parents have done. But while this is not a book that breaks much new ground for those who are in midst of the relevant debates, it does a terrific job taking stock of the current situation and the many challenges in the domain of digital communication—and does so from the professional and personal vantage point of one of our profession’s most distinguished members. It is a joy to read.