A Philosophical Guide to Chance: Physical Probability

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Toby Handfield, A Philosophical Guide to Chance: Physical Probability, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 264pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107607353.

Reviewed by Christopher J. G. Meacham, University of Massachusetts, Amherst


This is an excellent book. It is exceptionally clear and accessible, an ideal text for an undergraduate class on chance or the philosophy of physics. At the same time, it is cutting edge, critically engaging with and contributing to the recent literature on chance. Anyone interested in issues involving chance, whether ignorant of the literature or fully immersed in it, should get a copy.

As one would expect in a book on this topic, Handfield presents and critically evaluates some typical realist accounts of chance, and sketches some anti-realist alternatives and the challenges they face. But Handfield also ventures into a number of nearby issues in the philosophy of physics. He provides an informative discussion of the picture of the world suggested by classical physics, gently introduces the reader to both statistical mechanics and quantum mechanics, discusses the role of probability in the many-worlds interpretation, and assesses the implications of these theories on the temporal asymmetry of chance. And Handfield introduces the reader to an impressive number of other topics along the way, including degrees of belief, representation theorems, indifference principles, possibility, counterfactuals, haecceities, propositions, personal identity, self-locating beliefs, and more.

While Handfield is careful to give the reader a working knowledge of the relevant literature, he does not just review these debates; he also makes several contributions of his own. Three of these stand out. First, Handfield offers a characterization of our ordinary use of the term "chance" (a proposal which is further developed in Handfield and Wilson (forthcoming)), where (roughly) chances are the credences one ought to have, given the evidence which is "available" in the relevant context. He then uses this proposal to explain the temporal asymmetry of chance: since more evidence about the past is available to us than evidence about the future, chances about the past are more tightly constrained. Second, Handfield criticizes recent attempts to understand the probabilities that appear in the many-worlds interpretation of quantum mechanics as chances. In particular, he (i) challenges recent attempts by proponents of the many-worlds account to establish that aligning one's credences with such probabilities is rationally required, and (ii) argues that these probabilities cannot explain the frequencies of outcomes we observe. Third, Handfield argues in favor of anti-realist accounts of chance. And, using the recent literature on evolutionary debunking arguments against moral realism as a guide, he offers a debunking argument against realist accounts of chance.

All three of these are worthy contributions, and ones that I think will lead to fruitful debate. In the remainder of this review, I'll try to start this debate by considering some of the ways in which one might attempt to resist the heart of Handfield's third contribution, the debunking argument against realist accounts of chance.

Handfield's debunking argument against chance realism begins with a potential explanation for why we believe chance realism -- the view that there are real, objective chances:

[Handfield's Hypothesis (HH):] I suggest a hypothesis for the function of the ontological sophistication of chance. Part of the function of this concept is to quell the urge to seek further explanations. As we have already noted, sometimes it is maladaptive to seek further explanations. But having developed an aspect of our psychology that so persistently and doggedly seeks causal explanations and patterns in seemingly random phenomena, we have found it beneficial to posit an objective 'casual explanation canceling' feature of the world: chance. (241)

He then suggests that:

having become aware of a potential naturalistic explanation of why we might have the peculiar chance psychology that we do, and noting that this explanation does not require us to posit any tracking relation between objective chance facts and our chance psychology, we have reason to endorse an anti-realist account of chance as a superior explanation. (243)

Thus if we accept something like Inference to the Best Explanation (IBE), and if the best explanation for why we tend to believe chance realism is Handfield's Hypothesis, then we should be anti-realists about chance.[1]

More formally, we might set up the argument as follows:

The Debunking Argument:

P1. If we know X, and IBE yields explanation Y for X, then we should believe Y.

P2. We know that we tend to believe chance realism is true.

P3. IBE yields explanation HH for why we tend to believe chance realism.

L4. We should believe HH. (By P1, P2, P3.)

P5. If we learn that our belief in some proposition A does not track whether it's true, and in doing so gain no other reason for thinking A is true, then we should adopt a low degree of confidence in A.

P6. HH entails that our belief in chance realism does not track whether chance realism is true.

P7. HH does not give us any other reason for thinking chance realism is true.

C8. We should adopt a low degree of confidence in chance realism (and thus a high degree of confidence in anti-realism). (By L4, P5, P6, P7)

How might the proponent of chance realism reply to this debunking argument? Let's look at three potential objections.[2]

One objection is that P5 is too strong. Why should learning that our belief in A does not track the truth of A entail that we should adopt a low degree of confidence in A (and thus a high degree of confidence in ¬A)? After all, it doesn't seem that learning this gives us reason to believe A is false. At best, it would appear to justify suspending belief in A, or adopting symmetrical beliefs with respect to A and ¬A.

To avoid this objection, we could replace P5 with a weaker premise, P5*:

P5*. If we learn that our belief in some proposition A does not track whether it's true, and in doing so gain no other reasons for thinking A is true, then we should be equally confident in A and ¬A.

But unlike P5, P5* will not yield the desired conclusion -- that we should be anti-realists about chance. It will only yield the conclusion that we should be equally confident in realism and anti-realism.

Setting aside the worry that replacing P5 with P5* will not yield the desired conclusion, there are further worries which apply to even this weaker argument. So let us focus our attention on the weaker argument.

A second objection to the debunking argument is that it's difficult to find an understanding of "does not track the truth" that makes both P5* and P6 plausible. For example, one option is to take the manner in which we obtained our belief in A to not track the truth of A if we could still have obtained our belief in A if A were false. But this makes P5* implausibly strong. Since most of our beliefs are obtained in fallible ways, this would entail that almost all of our beliefs do not track the truth. And given P5*, it would follow that we should think that pretty much every one of our beliefs is equally likely to be true as false.[3]

Alternatively, one might take the manner in which we obtained our belief in A to not track the truth of A if the manner in which we came to have our belief in A is no more likely to have happened given the truth of A than the falsity of A. That is, we might take our belief in A to not track the truth of A if our belief in A is probabilistically independent of the truth of A.[4]

But again, this understanding makes P5* problematic. One worry stems from what we mean by "no more likely" here -- are the probabilities here chances, credences, the credences we ought to have given our evidence, or what?

A second and bigger worry is that P5* is implausible given any of these notions of probability. P5* claims that if we learn that our belief in A and the truth of A are probabilistically independent, then we should adopt the same credence in A as in ¬A. But the fact that our belief in A and the truth of A are probabilistically independent doesn't entail anything about the probability of A, nor does it entail anything about what our credence in A should be.

For example, suppose we learn that a chance process determined whether we would believe A or ¬A, and an independent chance process determined whether A or ¬A is true. This doesn't entail anything about what the chance of A is simpliciter -- the chance of A could be anything between 0 and 1. And it certainly doesn't entail anything about what our credence in A ought to be.

A third objection to the debunking argument is that P7 seems false: adaptive explanations like HH do give us a reason to think that chance realism is true. As Handfield notes, in order for the debunking argument to go through it's important that "the explanation we give does not presuppose the existence of chance" (242). For if it did, then one could not reasonably argue that we should both (i) believe this explanation, and (ii) believe that chances don't exist. But it seems that adaptive explanations like HH do employ chances. And if HH employs chances, then HH gives us a reason to believe there are chances, and P7 is false.

Why do adaptive explanations like HH seem to employ chances? Consider a canonical adaptive explanation, an explanation via natural selection, for why a given population has a certain heritable trait (e.g., why leopards have camouflaging fur patterns):

This heritable trait is at fixation in the population because the population is descended from an ancestral population in which individuals with this trait had a higher fitness -- a higher probability of survival and/or a greater expectation of reproductive success -- than individuals with the available variant traits.[5]

These kinds of explanations are fundamentally probabilistic.[6] They employ the probabilistic notion of fitness, and explain the presence of the trait by showing why it was highly probable that this trait would reach fixation in a given population. And these probabilities appear to be chances; they are of a kind with the probabilities of coin tosses and the like.[7] Certainly Handfield, who is happy to take the probabilities that appear in biology to be chances, would not resist this identification.[8]

Of course, these objections are the beginning of the debate, not the end of it. In response to the third objection, for example, proponents of the debunking argument might try several moves: they might attempt to employ some non-adaptive explanation in place of HH, they might try to offer an alternative way of understanding HH that doesn't appeal to probabilities, they might try to understand these probabilities in terms of credences or what our credences ought to be, or they might try to offer some anti-realist surrogate for chance, and argue that these surrogates can play the same role in explanations as the realist's chances. Each of these moves will encounter obstacles, and real philosophical work is required to see which of these responses, if any, is viable.[9] But it should be clear that this is an interesting and worthwhile debate, and one that will have far-reaching consequences on our understanding of chance. And there is no better place to start thinking about this debate than Handfield's book.[10]


Ariew, André. 1998. "Are Probabilities Necessary for Evolutionary Explanations?" Biology and Philosophy 13(2).

Handfield, Toby and Alastair Wilson. forthcoming. Chance and Context. In Asymmetries in Time and Chance. Oxford University Press.

Horan, Barbara L. 1994. "The Statistical Character of Evolutionary Theory." Philosophy of Science 61(1):76-95.

Lyon, Aidan. 2010. "Deterministic Probability: Neither Chance nor Credence." Synthese 182(3):413-432.

Millstein, Roberta L. 2003. "Interpretations of Probability in Evolutionary Theory." Philosophy of Science 70(5):1317-1328.

Rosenberg, Alexander. 1994. Instrumental Biology, or, the Disunity of Science. University of Chicago Press.

Schaffer, Jonathan. 2007. "Deterministic Chance?" The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 58:113-140.

Sober, Elliott. 1984. The Nature of Selection: Evolutionary Theory in Philosophical Focus. University of Chicago Press.

Sober, Elliott. 2000. Philosophy of Biology. Westview Press. Street, Sharon. 2006. "A Darwinian Dilemma for Realist Theories of Value." Philosophical Studies 127(1):109-166.

Vavova, Katia. forthcoming. Debunking Evolutionary Debunking. In Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Vol. 8, ed. Russ Shafer-Landau. Oxford University Press.

Ward, Barry. 2005. "Projecting Chances: A Humean Vindication and Justification of the Principal Principle." Philosophy of Science 72(1):241-261.

[1] Although Handfield explicitly models his debunking argument on similar arguments that have appeared in the ethics literature—and in particular, that of Street (2006)—it differs from these arguments in some interesting ways. For example, Street's argument seems to be something like this: if the evolutionary story about how we came to have our particular moral beliefs is right, and moral realism is true, then we should have a low degree of confidence in our particular moral beliefs; but surely we shouldn't have a low confidence in our particular moral beliefs; thus moral realism is false. By contrast, Handfield's argument does not appear to take the form of a reductio, and the conclusion of the argument seems to be that we shouldn't believe chance realism is true, not that chance realism isn’t true. (Thanks to Katia Vavova here.)

[2] For a discussion of some related worries facing moral debunking arguments, see Vavova (forthcoming).

[3] This is problematic not only because it's implausible; it also suggests that we'll be required to adopt credences that are probabilistically incoherent.

[4] To see that these two formulations are equivalent, note that the first states that p(B ∧ A|A) = p(B ∧ A|¬A). This entails that p(B ∧ A) = p(B ∧ A|A), which entails that A and B ∧ A are probabilistically independent.

[5] See Sober (2000), p.71.

[6] See Sober (1984), Millstein (2003).

[7] Since it's contentious whether the probabilities of coin tosses are chances, it will likewise be contentious whether these evolutionary probabilities are contentious. But there seems to be a growing consensus that something like chances do apply to events like these (coin tosses, evolutionary processes). For cases in favor of understanding evolutionary probabilities in particular as chances, see Sober (2000) and Millstein (2003).

[8] I've raised this worry by looking at natural selection explanations. But Handfield only assumes that there is a natural history explanation for our realist conception of chance, not that there is a natural selection explanation. Indeed, Handfield suggests that there is reason to think "the concept has been propagated overwhelmingly through cultural, rather than biological, means" (242).

Handfield does not spell out how this alternative "cultural propagation" explanation will go. But given his efforts to establish that having this realist conception of chance is "adaptive" and "beneficial", it's presumably supposed to proceed along roughly the same lines as natural selection explanations. (For example, it might go as follows: one establishes that having this concept is beneficial, supplies a further premise linking the chance of propagation of a concept to the degree to which it’s beneficial, and then concludes (with the help of some auxiliary assumptions) that it is highly likely that this concept would propagate across a population.) If so, then this kind of cultural propagation explanation will raise the same problems as natural selection explanations.

[9] In the context of evolutionary biology, arguments along the lines of the second and third responses have been offered by Horan (1994) and Rosenberg (1994); see Sober (1984), Ariew(1998) and Millstein (2003) for arguments against such understandings. A more recent (and general) defense of something like the third line of response has been given by Schaffer (2007); see Lyon (2010) for a reply. For an account one might employ to run the fourth line of response, see Ward (2005).

[10] Thanks to Maya Eddon and Katia Vavova for helpful comments and discussion.