A Philosophical Guide to Conditionals

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Bennett, Jonathan, A Philosophical Guide to Conditionals, Oxford, 2003, 408pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199258872.

Reviewed by Richard Mendelsohn, CUNY


There is now a fairly large literature on conditionals. It is difficult to follow, often quite technical, and partial to heresies, prominent among them, that Modus Ponens is not a valid argument form and that conditionals are not propositions. The problems have proved so intractable and the analyses have been so inventive, that there is almost no agreement even on fundamentals. Jonathan Bennett, who has made thoughtful contributions to the current debate, offers . Philosophical Guide to Conditionals to ease us into the mysteries. The book grew out of notes Bennett had compiled for a graduate seminar on conditionals he had offered over the years. All the twists and turns of the debates are in here.

That debate over conditionals can be traced back to antiquity. The standard truth-functional interpretation was articulated and defended by the Stoic logician Philo. In modern times, it has been championed by the giants who developed modern logic—Frege, and Russell—the last of whom conferred on it the now familiar name material conditional. The lively Stoic debate between Philo and Diodorus over the conditional anticipated one that took place at the beginning of the twentieth century between those who favored material implication and those who favored the strict implication described in the modal systems of C. I. Lewis. The idea behind the latter was to require some nexus between the states of affairs characterized in antecedent and consequent. The material conditional depends only upon the truth value of antecedent and consequent, regardless of any connection between the two. In the case of mathematics, this is not such a significant issue because each mathematical truth is, by its very nature, connected with every other mathematical truth. But in the everyday world of spatio-temporal objects, this is not so. Remember that p and q might well represent logically independent states of affairs, so the truth value of the conditional is determined not by any connection between the two—for there might not even be one—but only by the truth values assigned to them. If there need be no connection between the two (other than truth value), what is the sense to be attached to the claim If p then q (represented: p T q)? That is the fundamental puzzle.

The truth-functional interpretation is standard in logical and mathematical reasoning: v(p T q)=F iff v(p)=T and v(q)=F. Philosophers find this definition problematic for the reasons mentioned above, though the criticism tends to focus on the two Paradoxes of Material Implication that follow from it: first, that a false statement materially implies everything Θp T(p T q), and second that a true statement is materially implied by everything . T (p T q).1 These “paradoxes” have not posed such a problem for mathematicians, who find this definition thoroughly congenial to their own use of conditionals in mathematical proof, and who have even subtly infected the usage of the literate public by disseminating it through programming languages.

Of the 23 chapters (including introduction), Bennett devotes only two, §2 and §3, to the material conditional. The first is concerned with Grice’s defense via his notion of conversational implicature; the second is on Jackson’s defense via his notions of robustness and assertibility conditions. Bennett rejects both: he sees no profit in protecting the truth-functional interpretation by explaining the deviance of the ordinary from the material conditional in terms of appropriateness conditions for asserting conditionals. Bennett’s treatment is a bit too quick to be helpful to someone who has not already thoroughly studied these views. But, in any event, it is clear that Bennett’s real interest resides with the alternative views of the conditional.

§§4—9 are devoted to the probabilistic account put into play by Frank Ramsey, which evaluates a conditional in terms of the credence one attributes to the consequent when the antecedent is added into one’s set of beliefs. The Ramsey “test”, as it is known, is introduced in §2, but not fully engaged until §4, wherein Bennett also includes a brief introduction to the probability calculus. By analogy with Conditional Proof, on which one assumes p and tries to derive q, Ramsey’s proposal is that we add p to our belief structure and calculate the probability, on that addition, that q. If the probability is high, then we say If p then q. The standard way of understanding the Ramsey test is to equate the probability of a conditional with conditional probability. §5 is devoted to this Equation, as it is known. The problem with this equation is the subject of a famous result of David Lewis’s, and Bennett does a good job explaining the problem Lewis had identified: except in a most trivial case, there is simply no proposition that will have the same probability as a conditional probability over all probability distributions. Since this identification of conditional probability is so central to the probabilistic interpretation of conditionals, it is fairly widely held—and ably defended by Bennett—that these conditionals are not propositions, not truth-value bearers in the traditional sense. §6 defends subjective probability as the appropriate probability interpretation; §7 is a well-argued defense of the view that indicative conditionals lack truth value—indeed, Bennett identifies this as one of the major themes of his guidebook; §8 discusses the uses of indicative conditionals, and §9 discusses the logic of indicative conditionals.

The discussion to this point has been almost entirely devoted to indicative conditionals, and these are carefully distinguished from a whole different class of cases, the subjunctive conditionals, e.g. If A had been true, C would have been true (represented: A > C). The difference between the two was strikingly exhibited in a famous example of Ernest Adams: (1) If Oswald didn’t kill Kennedy, then someone else did, and (2) If Oswald hadn’t killed Kennedy, someone else would have. The first is clearly true, but the second is not. There is great perplexity about subjunctive conditionals. Unlike the material conditional, which is monotonic, i.e., if A T C then (A Λ B) T C, for any B, the subjunctive conditional is non-monotonic, i.e., just because A > C, it does not follow that (A Λ B) > C for every B. Subjunctive conditionals are the least congenial to the truth-functional interpretation. This is especially so for the case of contrary-to-fact conditionals, which are deemed true on the truth-functional interpretation simply because of the falsity of the antecedent. Quine found these entirely problematic, even, in a sense disreputable, burying them in the garbage bin with claims of necessity and possibility. Needless to say, they have been resurrected, and with the same possible worlds structure that has breathed life into necessity and possibility.

The focus in §§10—19 is on subjunctive conditionals and the possible world model developed by Lewis, Stalnaker, and Thomason for subjunctives, which Bennett links up as follows. If A had been true, C would have been true is true iff

C obtains at every member of some class W of A-worlds such that every member of W is closer to the actual world than is any A-world not in W. (p. 165)

Bennett begins with possible world semantics in §10, including a discussion of the ontological status of possible worlds. §11 focuses on the issue of “closest world” needed to fill out the analysis, which is picked up again in §14 on the matter of “legality.” In between, there is a heavy load on temporal issues: §§12 and 13 concern antecedent times and forks in the temporal order; §§18 and 19 deal with time’s arrow and backward conditionals. Miscellaneous issues about subjunctives are dealt with in §§15—17.

§§20—21 take a look back at Goodman’s approach to subjunctive conditionals, and the book ends, §§22—23, with a discussion of whether there can be a unified theory of indicative and subjunctive conditionals. I will close with a few words about this last point.

Bennett hews to a sharp distinction between indicative conditionals and subjunctive conditionals; indeed, the structure of the book reflects this view, with the first half devoted to indicatives and the second half devoted to subjunctives. This was not always Bennett’s view. Some years ago, he had held the relocation thesis, according to which, e.g., the conditional uttered now If you go swimming today, your cold will get worse is acceptable to us now if, and only if, the conditional uttered tomorrow, If you had gone swimming yesterday, your cold would have gotten worse, is acceptable to us tomorrow. In this same vein, Dudman suggested that Adams’s counterfactual (2) is not appropriately paired with the indicative (1), but with the indicative (3) If Oswald doesn’t kill Kennedy, someone else will. For (2) is acceptable to us now if, and only if, (3) was acceptable at some time before Oswald fired his fateful shot. So, what appeared to have been a sharp distinction between an indicative conditional and a subjunctive conditional is shown, on reflection, to be a distinction between two different indicative conditionals.

Bennett had been a relocator in earlier days, but he is no longer; and he expends a great deal of effort to defeat the thesis and a related one put forward by Edgington (“On Conditionals,” Mind 104 (1995), 235-329), which he calls the Correspondence Thesis:

For any A and C, if A > C is the right thing to think at a certain time, then at some earlier time . T C was the right thing to think.

The examples are ingenious, and the argumentation spirited, but, in the end, I find Edgington’s unification thesis both intellectually and aesthetically satisfying. But this does not detract from Bennett’s welcome guide, which exhibits good common sense—he defends Modus Ponens— presents good explanations of technical work to nontechnical readers, and most importantly, provides the only book available where we can find the whole literature on conditionals vigorously explained and analyzed.


1. Paraconsistent logicians have raised doubts about the first of the paradoxes, which they fondly term “explosion,” because it does not permit one to circumscribe the ill-effects of a contradiction, as one is normally able to do.