A Philosophy for the Science of Well-Being

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Anna Alexandrova, A Philosophy for the Science of Well-Being, Oxford University Press, 2017, 196 pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199300518.

Reviewed by Lorraine L. Besser, Middlebury College


Ostensibly, philosophy and science share goals that are fundamentally related to truth-seeking. Yet the ways in which each discipline pursues these goals are often vastly different and can lead to different claims about the nature of their object. The study of well-being is a prime example. Even despite increasing efforts to engage in interdisciplinary research, the science of well-being proceeds very differently than the philosophy of well-being, to the extent where we might reasonably question whether or not the science and philosophy are talking about the same thing.

Anna Alexandrova's ambitious and timely book tackles these concerns head-on, raising important questions regarding the relationship between philosophy and science, and offering insights into how one might inform the other. Written from the perspective of the philosophy of science, Alexandrova's aim is to develop a philosophy of the science of well-being that shows how the science of well-being can best succeed in delivering knowledge of well-being, and in explaining how and why that knowledge succeeds and fails (p. xv).

From the start, Alexandrova is critical of the presupposition that philosophy simply informs science; that is, that it is the job of the philosophers to do the theory and of the scientists to apply the theory. Rather, the position she proposes is much more of a reflective equilibrium between the practical constraints of scientific investigation and the theory that drives it. Traditional philosophical theories of well-being, such as eudaimonism, hedonism, and objective list theories, serve as inspirations for scientific study of well-being, but they cannot serve as justification for the tools science employs to learn about well-being. The theory Alexandrova offers is thorough, detailed, and complex. In this review, I'll lay out her overall approach and then consider critically two aspects of her argument that I think the study of well-being has the most to learn from: whether or not philosophers ought to strive to develop an inclusive theory of well-being and how it is that a science of well-being can be value-laden yet objective.

To get a feel for the structure of Alexandrova's approach, some terminology is in order. Traditional philosophical approaches towards well-being are deemed "high theories"; distinctive to high theories is that they seek to explain the well-being of a person considered in its most general form. Her discussion takes as examples of high theories hedonism, desire-based theories, and objective list theories -- the "Big Three", as she refers to them. Each of these strives to give an account of well-being that isn't contingent to specific features of a person nor the context in which she exists. High theories contrast with "mid-level theories", which are contextualized theories of well-being, specific to life stages and particular aspects of a person. The idea behind mid-level theories is that people can be considered from many different vantage points, and that each vantage point presents a unique perspective to consider one's well-being.

To illustrate, Alexandrova provides the example of Masha, a pregnant woman (pp. 6-7). During any given day, Masha's well-being can be analyzed in a variety of ways depending upon one's perspective. A Good Samaritan, watching pregnant Masha slip on an icy sidewalk, asks about her well-being and seems to have in mind her physical safety. A good friend, speaking privately with Masha at a dinner-party, asks about her well-being and seems to have much more in mind: the friend is likely interested in how Masha's lack of job security is affecting her mentally. A social worker, interviewing Masha as part of a check on first-time pregnant woman, asks about her well-being and is most interested in determining her capacity to provide financially for her child. Alexandrova argues that each of these contexts reveals a different form of well-being that high theories, in their efforts to be applicable to all people, cannot explain adequately. Rather, what seems to be at work in our various evaluations of Masha's well-being is a theory of well-being that is specific to the context in which we are evaluating her. Mid-level theories capture and explain this sense of well-being.

Mid-level theories are contextualized theories of well-being. As Alexandrova explains, three considerations inform the context of a mid-level theory (pp. 51-52). The first consideration is how we are to understand the subject of well-being. Rather than the generalized conception of human beings that high level theories work with, mid-level theories conceive of human beings as specifically "as the circumstances require" and might include groups such as "toddlers, adopted toddlers, adopted toddlers with Down's Syndrome, a country, caretakers of an ill spouse, and so on" (p. 51). Presumably, the circumstances Alexandrova refers to here are defined by the aims and intentions of the researcher. The second context-informing consideration is the actual inquirer herself: as Alexandrova phrases it, "who am I to the being whose well-being I wish to know?" (p. 51). The kind of well-being a Good Samaritan has in mind when asking about Masha's well-being is going to be very different than the kind of well-being Masha's oldest friend has in mind: the latter works with a "richer and more demanding" notion of well-being (p. 51). Finally, the third consideration covers the circumstances of the inquirer and specifically what position the inquirer is in to promote a subject's well-being. If an inquirer has resources to impact substantially a subject's well-being, then this fact ought to inform "the appropriate contrast class and thus the correct threshold of well-being" (p.52).

The notion of mid-level theories plays a central role within Alexandrova's discussion and her discussion of the mid-level theory of child well-being in Chapter 3 is rich and informative. Yet while it is clear how mid-level theories can inform the constructs and measures used in scientific study of well-being, I'm less clear on the implications of mid-level theories considered from the philosophical point of view. Alexandrova's official line is that high theories serve as inspiration for mid-level theories, while mid-level theories justify different constructs of well-being (p. xl). Alexandrova denies that high theories are what justifies mid-level theories (pp. xl; 52-43) and instead suggests that mid-level theories are justified by the above considerations regarding "the nature of kinds and the context of theorizing" (p. 53). In denying high theories a justificatory role, it becomes less clear what the real role for these theories is.

This point is complicated by Alexandrova's critical concerns regarding the status of high theories. Indeed, a central motivation of her project is a concern that philosophers working within well-being are developing theories too abstract and general to be able to guide scientific research. The problem is straightforward: Philosophers try to develop theories of well-being that capture well-being in its most general form, applicable to all. But, as we know, the standard way to argue against such a theory is to develop counterexamples of people who seem to be faring well, even though they do not fit the philosopher's description of well-being, or vice versa. In response, philosophers often tend to develop more abstract and complicated theories of well-being. As Alexandrova explains, this "greater intricacy, though it makes for a more defensible theory by philosopher's standards, typically compromises the connection between theory and measurement" (p. 27).

Alexandrova notes here what I agree is an important problem. The search to develop a one-sized fits all theory of well-being ironically leads in practice to a proliferation of intricate theories, differentiated sometimes only by the smallest degrees of variation. This makes it particularly hard to adjudicate between the theories and, to return to Alexandrova's point, to extract helpful information from them. The "philosophical gods are parsimony, universality, generality, immunity to counterexamples"; these are "different gods than those that would enable a connection between theories and measure" (p. 37).

This line of criticism -- which runs throughout the book -- raises a challenge to philosophy as it is traditionally conceived. If we are philosophizing on a topic, like well-being, that is also one which is studied scientifically and needs to be measured as part of that study, should we give up the traditional philosophical gods? Alexandrova falls short of making this bold claim, but her treatment of high theories leaves them on precarious grounds.

We see a glimpse of this precarious status within her discussion and defense of variantism, the view that there is no single theory of well-being underpinning the various constructs of well-being employed "life and science" (p. 27). Alexandrova advocates this position as a response to the clash between the philosopher's efforts to build a comprehensive theory of well-being and the scientist's efforts to measure well-being. Measuring well-being requires treating theories of well-being as models as opposed to theories:

When philosophical accounts are used by scientists, they are used as models rather than as theories. A model, in this sense, is a conceptual tool for building a measurement procedure. Unlike a theory, which fully specifies how it should be used, a model requires additional outside knowledge. Once we see that the science of well-being treats philosophical proposals as models, it is natural to think that there are many such models and that there is no single overarching model to regulate their use. (p. 27)

While Alexandrova maintains that her analysis of the role of mid-level theories is neutral with respect to whether or not we accept or reject variantism (pp. 52-53), it certainly seems to work much better when presented -- as Alexandrova does -- as embracing variantism.

Consider Alexandrova's illustration of child well-being as a mid-level theory. To develop the mid-level theory, we begin by looking at assumptions made by social scientists studying child well-being. These assumptions serve as constraints for what can count as a plausible theory of child well-being and help us to adjudicate between high theories. In the case of child well-being, Alexandrova argues that only a modified version of objective list theories can inspire the correct approach towards thinking about well-being, for the constraints rule out hedonism and desire-based theories.

Alexandrova insists that ruling out hedonism and desire-based theories does not amount to criticizing them as high theories themselves, or as theories that might be appropriate in other contexts, but it is hard to wrap one's head around what follows from this. Does the fact that hedonism is deemed inapplicable to child well-being not entail a problem with hedonism? And where would we have ended up if we rejected variantism and embraced hedonism as the single high theory? Alexandrova strives to maintain neutral with respect to high theories, yet this is a fine and difficult line to balance. Here -- and at other critical junctures -- we see Alexandrova defaulting to place more weight on the "science" of well-being than the "philosophy" of well-being. This move is consistent with her stated methodology -- she prefaces her book by stating clearly that she writes as a philosopher of science interested in exploring how and why the science of well-being is possible -- but is one that ends up leaving many of the philosophical questions we have regarding high theories unanswered.

One cannot have everything, however, and whatever limitations a philosopher of well-being might see within this project might very well be outweighed by Alexandrova's contributions to the science of well-being. Let's turn now to consider just one of these: this is her suggestion of how the science of well-being can be value-laden and yet nonetheless objective. This challenge is one that plagues many areas within the social sciences and Alexandrova's suggestions here ought to have a broad reach. Her basic strategy is to develop a way of identifying and understanding the kinds of value-laden claims invoked in the science of well-being and then show how these claims can develop a kind of procedural objectivity.

The value-laden claims invoked in the science of well-being ought to be treated as "mixed claims." Mixed claims are causal or correlational claims that involve at least one variable that presupposes a value judgement (p. 82). For example, a claim stipulating that long commutes are associated with lower levels of well-being is a mixed claim. It makes a correlational claim between two variables, one which presupposes the value judgment about the dis-value of lower levels of well-being. Rather than ignoring the value-laden aspect of this variable, Alexandrova (rightly, I think) stresses the need to recognize and pay attention to the implicit value judgment that transforms the claim from a straightforward empirical claim to a mixed claim.

Alexandrova's hope is that establishing that a claim is a mixed claim triggers a unique procedure for dealing with its value-ladenness. Recognition that a given claim is mixed, and treating it as such, places scientists in a position to avoid either imposing the value judgment upon a population that very well might have good reason to reject it, or simply failing to recognize that they are employing value judgments. Rather, when working with mixed claims, scientists ought to (1) make their presuppositions explicit; (2) check those presuppositions for controversy; and (3) when faced with controversy, consult the relevant parties for their views, rather than a high or mid-level philosophical theory. These steps, Alexandrova argues, ought to give mixed claims a kind of procedural objectivity insofar as it "survives public scrutiny" (p. 102).

In her discussion of mixed claims, Alexandrova nicely diagnoses where it is that scientists are likely to lose objectivity in their study of well-being. It is easy to look at statistical claims about well-being and to forget the implicit value judgments that they make. Providing a straightforward methodology to trigger attention to the value judgments is a helpful, practical solution and, to my mind, Alexandrova's specific suggestions do not ask too much of scientists, nor do they impose too much philosophy upon them. As Alexandrova stresses, making the presuppositions explicit might entail that scientists need to pay more attention to philosophy; yet she convincingly argues that "a failure to philosophize about the nature of well-being is a failure of procedural objectivity (p. 100). Some philosophers may worry that Alexandrova's treatment of mixed claims doesn't grant enough weight to philosophical discussions of well-being. It does seem that the role for philosophy here is somewhat minimal, especially in the third stage where controversies are settled by politics and consultation with the relevant parties. But I also agree with Alexandrova's hesitation to require too much of scientists, with her desire to avoid treating philosophers as philosopher kings and queens and with her aspirations to ensure the public trustworthiness of science. She might reach her conclusion that "Where philosophy gives out, politics should step in" (p. 102), too quickly for some, but her approach might be just what is needed to help scientists not only to better studying well-being, but also to feel more confident in approaching areas, like well-being, that need scientific study yet whose study forces them to deal with value judgments.

To conclude, Alexandrova's book is an important contribution to the study of well-being that warrants a careful study. It raises genuine challenges for both philosophers and scientists of well-being. If we take these challenges seriously, the study of well-being will no doubt progress.