A Philosophy of Cinematic Art

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Berys Gaut, A Philosophy of Cinematic Art, Cambridge UP, 2010, 324 pp., $30.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521529648.

Reviewed by Carl Plantinga, Calvin College



Berys Gaut’s excellent new book, A Philosophy of Cinematic Art, is a force to be reckoned with in the philosophy of cinema, a subfield of aesthetics that has recently seen a flurry of scholarly interest and publication. Writing on cinema by philosophers dates back at least to Hugo Munsterberg, a colleague of William James at Harvard University, and his 1916 The Photoplay: A Psychological Study. Analytic aestheticians, with a few exceptions, had until the past few decades been reluctant to take up the subject of cinema (let alone its artistically suspect younger sibling, television), preferring to examine the more traditional fine arts. As the 20th Century marched on, this resistance became increasingly anachronistic. Noël Carroll, George Wilson, and Gregory Currie began publishing books on the philosophy of film in the later 1980s and the 1990s, and numerous other philosophers turned their attention to cinema as well. Today several excellent books and anthologies on the philosophy and theory of cinema are available, and the topic has become one of the most active and exciting areas of aesthetics.

Gaut’s book appears as a kind of second-wave philosophy of cinema, and threads its way between the debates of the past three decades, carefully describing the issues of contention. Although Gaut’s positions on various issues raise serious questions (as most philosophical positions will), its contributions are many, not least of which are the clarity, efficiency, and energy of the writing and thinking, the intelligent and insightful discussions of particular films when the subject warrants it, and Gaut’s familiarity with both digital cinema and video games, the latter of which he considers to be a form of cinema — interactive cinema. The book’s central contributions, in my opinion, are three in number: (1) it provides a clear overview of many of the salient issues in the philosophy of cinema, together with Gaut’s forcefully argued positions on the relevant debates; (2) it contains sophisticated discussions of the implications of developments in digital cinema and video games for cinema theory; and (3) it defends the beleaguered idea of medium specificity in some of its forms, thus reaffirming the importance of the specific characteristics of the medium for cinema theory and criticism.

Before going any further it would be wise to identify Gaut’s particular way of discussing cinema. For Gaut, cinema is the medium of moving images. Since moving images come in many different kinds, Gaut distinguishes between traditional celluloid-based photographic cinema, digital cinema, animated cinema, and electronic cinema (television). The idea that moving images lie at the heart of the medium is not a new one; other scholars have proposed that photographic films, animations, and digital media should be grouped under the umbrella term “moving image media,” and that “moving image studies” would be a useful rubric to describe the field of academic study encompassing the study of such moving images and associated forms of communication and art. Yet Gaut’s proposal that the moving image media be called “cinema” is novel, in that “cinema” has heretofore been associated with traditional photographic motion pictures, the word having a 19th century feel deriving from its origins in that ground-breaking invention of the Lumiére brothers, the cinématographe.

Since one of the goals of philosophy is to promote conceptual clarity, one sees the value of calling the medium “cinema,” and identifying kinds of cinema under this broad rubric. The terminology is stipulative, however, and its uptake in the broader community dependent on the negotiation of several political landmines, not least of which is the unlikelihood that video game and/or television scholars will look kindly on conceptualizing their chosen media as forms of cinema. One envisions a television scholar archly suggesting that traditional cinema be considered a form of television (photochemical television?), or the video game scholar insisting that video games constitute a new medium separate altogether from cinema. I happen to like Gaut’s terminology, but not everyone will.

In the book Gaut clearly details the salient issues that philosophers and film theorists have so far grappled with. What sets this book apart is Gaut’s careful attention to how the old debates about traditional cinema relate to new forms of cinema, and especially digital cinema and interactive cinema (video games). While these discussions make the book especially useful and quite up to date, one wonders why electronic cinema (television) is almost completely ignored.

In the first chapter Gaut turns to Roger Scruton’s argument against taking photography and cinema as art forms because as photographic media, they record what is in front of the camera automatically and thus cannot express thought. One might question whether Scruton’s arguments need be taken seriously any longer, and indeed, Gaut does summarily reject them. Along the way, however, Gaut provides some fascinating discussions of Rudolph Arnheim’s theory of film and on differences between analog and digital photography. The second chapter examines whether film is a language (Gaut claims that it is not) and discusses the nature and types of realism in both traditional and digital cinema. Gaut here argues, contra Kendall Walton, that photographs are not transparent, since in seeing a photograph the light rays emanating from the object photographed do not pass directly into our eyes. All images, both traditional and cinematic, are opaque.

In the third chapter Gaut vehemently opposes the auteur theory, or the theory that one person, typically the film’s director, should be considered to be the “author” of the film, and instead argues for multiple authorship in the case of most movies. He also discusses these issues in relation to digital and interactive cinema. In “Understanding Cinema,” Chapter 4, Gaut rejects intentionalism as a theory of interpretation of collaborative artforms. He also rejects film theorist David Bordwell’s constructivisim in favor of what Gaut calls “detectivism.” This prepares the way for his “patchwork theory” of film interpretation, which holds that several factors figure into determining the correct interpretation of a film, of which the intentions of the makers are only one. In illustrating his patchwork theory, Gaut provides a fascinating demonstration of the patchwork theory in practice in his discussion of Akira Kurosawa’s Rashomon.

In Chapter 5 Gaut discusses cinema narration, identifying and rejecting three models of implicit cinematic narrators, and arguing that only explicit voice-over narrators ought to be acknowledged in the cinema. Along the way Gaut provides an excellent account of major differences between film and literature, an account that serves as evidence for his contention that medium-specificity has a role to play in the philosophy of cinema. Finally in this chapter, Gaut also turns to interactive narration, that is, to how we should think of narration in interactive media such as video games.

Emotion and identification are the subject of Chapter 6, in which Gaut explains the medium-specific ways that cinema fosters emotional engagement, and defends the notion of “identification” from those who consider the concept to be too vague or ill-defined. Gaut finds it curious that most cognitive and analytic theorists and philosophers have rejected the notion of identification altogether as either confused or too broad and ambiguous. Noël Carroll, for example, has rejected identification because it ostensibly presumes a kind of Vulcan mind-meld between audience and character. Gaut notes that the etymological root of “identification” is of “making identical,” but claims that the meaning of a term “is a matter of its use in the language” (255), not in its etymology.

Fair enough, but one wonders if Gaut’s definition of identification succeeds in identifying the use of the word in ordinary language, or else stipulates a definition that Gaut claims to be more precise. Gaut defines identification as “imagining oneself in a character’s situation” (258), and goes on to distinguish between two broad sorts of identification, imaginative and empathic identification. Imaginative identification can itself be subdivided into various types, including perceptual, affective, motivational, epistemic, practical, and perhaps other forms, depending on what aspect of the character’s situation the audience imagines itself to be in. Empathic identification, on the other hand, occurs when one shares one or more of the character’s (fictional) emotions because one has projected oneself into the character’s situation. One might ask why we should take empathy to be identification at all, rather than an emotional response to identification, if identification is defined as an act of the imagination rather than a kind of emotional response. Further discussion would take us too far afield, but there are other questions that could be asked of Gaut’s theory of identification.

This book can be seen in part as a challenge to Noël Carroll’s sustained critique of media specificity. Thus Gaut’s concluding chapter affirms three medium-specificity claims that Gaut holds to be not only correct, but necessary for a proper appreciation of the cinema. He distinguishes between a medium and art form, describes how media can be nested within each other, and says that medium specificity has less to do with uniqueness than it does with what he calls differential properties. This chapter also serves as a useful summary of the main points of the book, in which Gaut illustrates each of his three medium-specificity claims by reminding us of the conclusions he came to earlier in the book, and of how they illustrate specific characteristics of the medium of moving pictures.

Berys Gaut’s overall achievement in A Philosophy of Cinematic Art is substantial, among other things, for his persuasive argument for medium specificity, and for his attention to new forms of cinema. This accomplished book is essential in the library of anyone interested in the philosophy of cinema.