A Philosophy of Freedom

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Lars Svendsen, A Philosophy of Freedom, Kerri Pierce (tr.), Reaktion Books, 2014, 287pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781780233703.

Reviewed by Stewart Goetz, Ursinus College


According to Lars Svendsen, "This book is a defence of freedom" (9). It is concerned with the compatibility of freedom with a scientific worldview, the place of freedom in the political arena, and the relationship between freedom and the meaning of life. In this review, I summarize some of the central points of Svendsen's engaging book and then raise a few questions that arose in my mind while reading it.

Svendsen approaches the topic of freedom from a naturalistic standpoint, in the broadest sense of that expression. "That is, I assume that nothing exists outside of the natural universe (or that if anything does exist, it cannot influence the natural universe whatsoever and therefore cannot be used to explain it)" (246, endnote 8). Nevertheless, he believes the sciences in general, or the natural sciences in particular, cannot tell us everything that is worth knowing about human life and that ontological and explanatory reductionisms are false (246, endnote 8). The character of Svendsen's broad naturalism is most clearly evident in his treatment of ontological freedom. While "Truly convincing arguments for or against determinism or for or against libertarianism just do not appear to exist" (65), Svendsen believes libertarianism is the most intuitively plausible position, and he maintains he will continue to espouse it until he is convinced that the basic idea of freedom, which is having the ability to do otherwise than one actually did ("under identical conditions" (51)), can be satisfactorily accounted for within a determinist (including compatibilist) framework (65).

Svendsen claims that indeterminism in the context of ontological freedom of action gives rise to its own seemingly problematic issues. First and foremost is why an undetermined action is not a random or chance event (41). While some will invoke the concept of agent causation to address this concern, Svendsen believes this is a step back into the causal explanatory nexus and "that a discussion of agent causality is simply an unsuccessful attempt to apply causal terms to action explanations" (54-55). For an adequate explanation of human freedom, one must invoke explanations in terms of reasons (even "a libertarian proponent of agent causality will now claim that [agent] A must function as a cause in a way not fully explainable by any preceding causes. A initiates action for reasons, and these reasons cannot be reduced to natural causal factors" (53)). Reasons explanations are irreducible teleological explanations (explanations in terms of purposes, not causal explanations (53-58), and this entails that there is no seamless causal explanatory story about what takes place in the physical world; in other words, there are explanatory gaps in the physical causal story (56).

The concept of freedom is linked closely to the ideas of responsibility and autonomy. "Freedom implies having personal responsibility, it gives you responsibility . . . . I am responsible for me, for what I choose to do . . . and for the type of person I want to become" (76). To choose to be a kind of person is to define oneself, and "the self-defined life which regards the capacity of choice as central" is the "autonomous life" (76). "Choice is autonomous" (85) and "being autonomous means being responsible for one's own life, both when things are working out and when things are going to hell" (77). "In order to be autonomous one must act according to reasons" (85). One acts for a reason, even when what one does is "other than [one's] reason might dictate" (85). In other words, irrational action is not non-rational action.

So much for ontological freedom. There is also political freedom and the two concepts are related: "every adult who does not suffer from some serious, obviously debilitating pathology must be considered autonomous," and this has "consequences for the individual's . . . political status" (86). Stated slightly differently, the internal ontological conditions of personal autonomy have implications for what most befits an individual in the external world of the polis. Most succinctly, the idea of internal autonomy entails the idea of external rights (77); "autonomous existence requires people to have a significant number of alternatives and lifestyles open to them and the liberal democracy is the governmental form that best safeguards pluralism" (91). There is and must be an "inviolable freedom space" for the citizens of a liberal democracy (91). "All politics are a form of social engineering" (158), but because "mankind is characterized by value pluralism" we "ought to attempt to promote the peaceful co-existence of groups and individuals with various and incompatible ideas of the good life" (159). "Liberalism is not a theory of the good, but rather of the right. A liberal theory does not provide a recipe for the good life, but simply observes that the good life can take many forms and attempts to set forth the conditions necessary for the realization of these" (97). So freedom in the polis, while it is a good with "more than mere instrumental worth" (97), is instrumental insofar as it enables citizens to choose to live what they believe is a good life. Thus, freedom is a high good, but not the highest.

Svendsen maintains that the conditions of a good life are best realized in a liberal democracy. What is a liberal democracy? Most generally, "'liberal' indicates that a state's power over its citizens should be limited and 'democracy' that the citizens should have power over the state" (94). But the expression "liberal democracy" is imbued with internal tensions. For example, a democratic state is not necessarily liberal when it overrides its minorities' interests and fails to grant to them the rights to freedom of expression and religion. Similarly, a liberal state that denies its citizens the right to vote is not democratic. Thus, "a democracy without such liberal rights as freedom of expression and freedom of the press will be a democracy only in name, and a liberal state where the citizens do not have the right to influence the state's government through voter participation is not genuinely liberal" (94).

This concludes my necessarily too-brief overview of Svendsen's book. I have left out much of interest: informed discussions of hard determinism, compatibilism, positive and negative political freedom, paternalism, and the views of philosophers such as Harry Frankfurt, P. F. Strawson, Hegel, Kant, Friedrich Hayek, and Robert Nozick. At this point, I believe it is helpful to raise some questions that, as best as I can determine, Svendsen never answers. The first concerns Svendsen's avowed "broad" naturalism. It seems to me that his naturalism is naturalism in name only. For example, I would be hard pressed to name a naturalist who acknowledges causal gaps in the explanatory story of events in the physical world. And I would be equally hard pressed to name a naturalist who concedes a role for irreducible teleological explanations in these gaps. Indeed, naturalists like David Papineau and David Rosenthal maintain that a naturalist worldview is one that maintains that all physical events are ultimately explicable without any mention of irreducible teleological explanations. Hence, while Svendsen's claim that teleological explanation is at the heart of ontological libertarian freedom is plausible, the reality of this freedom and this kind of explanation is something that naturalists standardly deny.

I say that Svendsen's naturalism "seems" to be naturalism in name only. My reason for hesitating to say outright that it is not naturalism is his almost complete silence about the ontological status of the self or person that has ontological libertarian freedom. At one point, Svendsen says that "Going by what we know today . . . we can say that it is unwarranted simply to claim an identity between the brain and consciousness" (46). Thus not only is it "a mistake to look for freedom in the brain," but it is also "a mistake to look for the self in the brain" (47). He also maintains that we cannot locate the self just by pointing to it, "but if we nonetheless want to situate it, we might say that the self is simply found in the body" (47). Svendsen quotes Kant (Dreams of a Spirit-Seer) that "where I feel, it is there that I am. I am as immediately in my finger-tip as I am in my head . . . My soul is wholly in my whole body, and wholly in each of its parts" (47).

Does Svendsen believe in the existence of the soul? If he does, then his assumption "that nothing exists outside of the natural universe (or that if anything does exist, it cannot influence the natural universe whatsoever and therefore cannot be used to explain it)" (246, endnote 8) seems highly suspect. Any naturalist would surely insist that even if there is a causal gap in the physical story, it cannot be filled by the purposeful causal activity of a soul. But if Svendsen denies the existence of the soul, one is left wondering why he does, given his belief in the existence of causal gaps. He does refer favorably to the libertarian Robert Kane in a footnote (251, endnote 42), and Kane explicitly denies the soul's existence on the grounds that it is a reactionary mistake to believe its existence is required to explain ontological libertarian freedom (1996: 94). But here Kane is mistaken. Belief in the soul's existence is not a reactionary view espoused to explain this kind of freedom. As has been pointed out in numerous places (e.g., Bering 2006; Humphrey 2011), a belief in the soul's existence is intuitively plausible. Given Svendsen inclines toward the view that we have ontological libertarian freedom on the grounds that its intuitive plausibility has not been undermined (65), why would he not, given his broad naturalism, embrace the same kind of position with regard to the existence of the soul?

Finally, there are interesting issues that arise in light of Svendsen's views of morality, self-interest, and meaning in life within the framework of broad naturalism. Naturalists standardly deny the existence of an afterlife. On their view, death is the irreversible termination of a person's existence. If it is, why automatically assume, as naturalists typically do (and, here, Svendsen is a good naturalist), that one should be moral, given that being moral requires restraint with respect to one's pursuit of what is good for oneself? After all, if this life is the only life one has to live, why is it not just as reasonable for one to try to maximize one's own well-being at the expense of the well-being of others, when one can do so without adverse repercussions? Svendsen reminds us that in a liberal democracy there is not only freedom but also equality (Chapter 8), and the rights of others need to be acknowledged and respected both morally and civilly. One has a reason (respect for the good life of others) to be moral. But the problem is that one also has a reason to pursue and maximize one's own good in life. When the two conflict, why is it all things considered more reasonable to act for the former reason and not for the latter? At one point, Svendsen writes: "The fact is that people consistently choose alternatives that they know will not personally benefit them because they think it to be morally right in a given situation. . . . A person who never behaved in that way could hardly be described as anything but a psychopath" (181). But what is needed at this juncture is an explanation for why the person who chooses self-interest over morality is less rational overall than the person who chooses morality over self-interest. Given that everyone ultimately ends up in the same condition in a naturalistic world, namely, dead, regardless of how they have lived their lives, the rational egoist seems at least as rational as the rational moralist.

One might respond that my line of questioning presupposes a subjectivist conception of self-interest: what makes life worth living and, thereby, meaningful is a subjective condition such as feeling pleasure. But that assumption is erroneous. Perhaps it is, but perhaps it is not. In any case, it is doubtful that Svendsen would give this response. He discusses the work of Susan Wolf on a meaningful life and points out that, according to her, "life lacks meaning if it is thoroughly egocentric, if it is solely devoted to the subject's well-being and not to implementing values outside of the subject's own good" (234). However, says Svendsen,

this is an exceptionally strong requirement for meaning, since it holds that achieving meaning in your own life is possible only if you add value to other people's lives. Expressed in these terms, I believe that the requirement is too strong, and I do not see why a hermit in a cave, who is cut off from all human contact, and who, for example, devotes his life to the worship of his god, cannot achieve genuine meaning in life (234-35).

But if a hermit can live a meaningful life, why cannot the person who lives in a liberal democracy and successfully preys on others without being caught also live a meaningful life? Indeed, why cannot the successful despot who says "The hell with liberal democracy" live a meaningful life? As Svendsen acknowledges, "it is certainly not obvious that a meaningful life must be a morally good one. A concentration camp commander, whose existence is, morally speaking, one of the worst imaginable, can still love his job and live an extremely meaningful life" (224). Svendsen responds that "It should be uncontroversial to state that certain actions and lifestyles are to be preferred above others, for example, that Raoul Wallenberg's life was morally better than Adolf Eichmann's" (225). True, Wallenberg's life was morally better. But in terms of self-interest, Eichmann's life seems preferable. How, then, is it the case that the former automatically trumps the latter, all things considered?

There is a serious issue here that Svendsen does not address. But one cannot be faulted for not doing everything in a book. Svendsen has written an excellent book that is thoroughly enjoyable to read. I highly recommend it.


Bering, J. (2006) "The Folk Psychology of Souls," Behavioral and Brain Sciences 29: 453-62.

Humphrey, N. (2011) Soul Dust, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.

Kane, R. (1996) The Significance of Free Will, Oxford: Oxford University Press.