A Philosophy of Gardens

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David E. Cooper, A Philosophy of Gardens, Oxford University Press, 2006, 173pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199290342.

Reviewed by Donald Crawford, University of California at Santa Barbara


In these times of anti-essentialism, it is refreshing to find an author who unapologetically takes on the challenge of analyzing what is distinctive or irreducible in a realm of human experience, in this case the appreciation of gardens and engagement in the practice of gardening.  His conclusions will surprise most readers, even those who love gardens or enjoy gardening, as he concludes that gardening is a practice that, if engaged in with an appropriate sensibility, embodies more saliently that any other practice the truth of the relation between human beings and their world. Further, exemplary gardens embody not merely co-dependence between human endeavor and the natural world, but a relation to the 'deep ground' of the world and ourselves.  For Cooper, the garden is an epiphany of man's relationship to the mystery of existence.

Given these metaphysical conclusions, it is not surprising that Cooper, a professor of philosophy at the University of Durham, begins by lamenting and attempting to explain modern philosophy's relative neglect of the garden as a topic for philosophical analysis and reflection.  He observes that many philosophical questions about gardens are equally well formulated about artworks: What is a garden?  Is it simply a complex physical object?  What makes a garden successful or great?  These topics do not engage him, however, nor is he concerned with the historical and cultural significance of gardens.  Rather, his main concern is with the significance gardens have for people engaged in the activity of gardening and in appreciating gardens -- why gardens and gardening matter and how they relate to the good life.

Cooper explores and rejects the assimilation of garden appreciation to the aesthetic appreciation of art, nature, or of any combination of these, arguing that such factoring analyses result in there being nothing distinctive about garden appreciation.  "A garden is what it is, and not something else -- art, nature or art-and-nature.  And the same goes for garden appreciation." (p. 60) He also rejects the more plausible view that garden appreciation involves a shifting between these two modes of appreciation that evolves into an appreciative awareness of the interaction of art and nature, arguing that this "fails to provide a plausible phenomenology of an important dimension of garden appreciation" (p. 54).  He calls this "atmosphere," and relates it to Merleau-Ponty's concept of "field of presence" or "latent significance" -- a sense of place as a whole that precedes attention to its constituent things and properties and that guides the appreciative experience that follows.  What is troublesome here is that this phenomenological account is in no way unique to the experience of gardens. When our experience is of a temporally and/or spatially complex object, the phenomenology of stages or modes of appreciation is also complex.  It would apply equally to the appreciation of environmental art, architecture and indeed music.  Cooper correctly observes that not all the countless features of a garden can be relevant to its appreciation, and so the question is how to identify the relevant features.  His conclusion is that "appreciation of the garden cannot be compounded from awareness of features independently of their relation to the whole: for these are not the same features as those experienced when appreciating the garden as a whole" (p. 57).  But this thesis, or some more limited version of it, holds for appreciating each of the arts and for the appreciation of nature as well.  Once again, I do not see how this analysis yields what is distinctive or unique about garden appreciation.

At this point Cooper shifts away from the aesthetics of gardens and turns to the practice of gardening itself as a possible source for answers to the question of why gardens matter to us.  Here he includes mundane activities such as digging, mowing, and weeding -- indeed any activity geared to the design, cultivation, and care of the garden.  What makes these activities satisfying to us?  Cooper rejects both hedonistic and instrumental answers to this question. A hedonistic analysis fails in that what is satisfying in the practice of gardening is not the net pleasure gained from it.  An instrumental analysis fails in that what is satisfying is not creating a finished product with instrumental value, but instead engaging in an ongoing enterprise -- a commitment to maintaining, enhancing, and transforming the garden.  Thus there are deeper reasons why gardening is significant for people, and Cooper correctly identifies any number of them: pride in growing one's own vegetables and consuming or sharing what one has grown, feeling some communion with nature, providing a structure and regularity to one's life, being physically engaged in activities that mediate between the human and non-human worlds, promoting a sense of community with other gardeners and visitors, and the garden being a refuge for the individual and a place for reverie.

The fundamental question of the significance of gardens -- why gardens and garden practices matter to people -- thus lies in their relation to what Cooper calls "the good life."  He makes clear that he does not mean the life of doing one's duty, exercising one's rights, or promoting social utility, namely those moral components of living that have become the major focal points of modern moral philosophy.  Rather, he urges an Aristotelian-like reflection on excellences or virtues of character that form the quality of one's life as a whole -- what Aristotle described as dispositions towards appropriate ways of acting, judging and feeling.   Cooper claims that garden practices "invite and attract certain virtues by providing especially appropriate opportunities for their exercise" (p. 91).

What, then, does Cooper identify as the "virtues of the garden," or, perhaps better put, what virtues does he claim are induced by garden-practices?  His answer is surprising, because he does not advance traditional empirical claims such as that gardening enhances one's feeling of well-being or develops responsibility and independence.  In fact, Cooper maintains that his claim is not empirical at all. On the contrary, he argues, certain garden-practices, when engaged in with a proper understanding of what they are, necessarily induce virtues and therefore these virtues are "internal" to these garden-practices (pp. 92-93).  He illustrates this claim with an extended example, which is worth repeating here.  Take the practice of a person growing a garden vegetable such as squash, which requires understanding the needs of the plant if it is to be healthy and worthy of consumption. This gardener's practice thus exhibits care, manifesting a virtue that is akin to respect for life.  Second, the discipline of caring for the plant and the garden as a whole "imposes a structure and pattern on a life that might otherwise be lacking in shape and unity" (p. 95), and this modulates into care for oneself -- another virtue.  Third, experiencing the garden product -- the squash -- as a "gift of nature," so to speak, exhibits another virtue -- humility, which Cooper claims closely relates to hope, and, more specifically, to trust or confidence that the conditions under which we live are conducive to the health of the garden and its products -- in other words, that nature can be cooperative in leading to our well being.  There are additional virtues he mentions in passing, such as the humility that may come with dining al fresco and the friendship and sense of community that shared garden activities can induce.  I cannot quarrel with these examples, but I fail to see how their status differs from empirical claims about the mental states and dispositions induced by garden practices and activities.  The basis for the stronger philosophical point Cooper wants to make that there is a necessary connection between garden-practices and virtues escapes me.

However, suppose Cooper is right about this.  How unique a feature of gardening and garden appreciation would this be?  Some would argue that playing a team sport promotes the virtue of cooperation and, for all I know, that stamp collecting promotes the virtue of careful attention to detail and organizing one's priorities in life.  Would the next step in explaining such claims be to assert that there is a necessary connection between these activities and these virtues?  I think not.

The final three chapters of the book deal with the issue of how particular gardens or garden practices can be said to mean something.  Cooper begins by cataloguing and briefly explaining seven different "modes" of meaning, such as instrumental, depictive, allusive, and expressive.  But his real interest is the question of what "The Garden" means.  Here he follows Nelson Goodman's notion of exemplification in Languages of Art, suggesting that the meaning of The Garden -- by which he means an exemplary garden -- is what it exemplifies; that is, its meaning is a property or set of properties that it both possesses and refers to, though not by means of depiction, expression, or allusion. 

What are these exemplified properties that are unique to the garden?   Readers who were pleased when Cooper waxed metaphysical in earlier chapters will delight in the penultimate chapter, mystically titled "The Garden as Epiphany."  Cooper begins with a so-called "modest proposal" that The Garden exemplifies (1) the dependence of human activity upon the cooperation of the natural world and (2) the degree to which experience of the natural environment depends upon human activity (pp. 135-36).  In other words, gardens do not simply depend upon nature -- an obvious fact -- but also exemplify this very dependence, and at the same time, they exemplify the dependence of nature -- the garden -- on human activity. 

However, Cooper is not satisfied with this modest proposal.  He doesn't reject it but rather thinks it is overly modest, and this is where the "epiphany" comes in.  The co-dependency mentioned above "itself embodies or refers us to the co-dependence of human existence and the 'deep ground' of the world and ourselves" (p. 144).  In other words, "The Garden … is an epiphany of man's relationship to mystery," and "this relationship is its meaning" (ibid.).  Thus Cooper's final conclusion is that

gardening or cultivation [is] a practice which, engaged in with an appropriate sensibility … embodies more saliently than any other practice the truth of the relation between human beings, their world, and the 'ground' from which the 'gift' of this world comes. (pp. 160-61)

Well, perhaps this is the case for some philosopher-gardeners who have assimilated Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty.  My hunch is that most gardeners are content to create an interesting garden design, tend the garden through the seasons, eat or display its products and often share them with others, but when push comes to shove they are more concerned with killing moles and gophers and keeping the rabbits in check than with the garden exemplifying what Kant referred to as the supersensible substrate of nature.

Cooper's thoughtful and engaging book is indeed A Philosophy of Gardens -- his rather unique and stimulating way of conceptualizing how, carefully reflected upon, gardening practices and appreciation can engender an epiphany of sorts on the mysteries of existence.