A Philosophy of Madness: The Experience of Psychotic Thinking

A Philosophy Of Madness The Experience Of Psychotic Thinking

Wouter Kusters, A Philosophy of Madness: The Experience of Psychotic Thinking, Nancy Forest-Flier (trans.), MIT Press, 2020, 738pp., $39.95, ISBN 9780262044288.

Reviewed by Justin Garson, Hunter College/The Graduate Center, City University of New York


This is a dangerous book.

A meditation on water metaphors in Husserl’s Phenomenology of Internal Time-Consciousness culminates in an involuntary hospitalization. A careful exposition of the schizophrenic “word salad” transforms, almost imperceptibly, into word salad. Philosophical musings alternate with fragments of a mad diary at such a dizzying rate that there are lengthy passages where the reader simply does not know whether she is reading a philosophical exposition or a mad diary.

But the fact that this is possible, that is, the fact that a text could be indeterminate in this manner (madness or philosophy?), points to a profound problem, one that the entire book is designed to confront. What, exactly, is the relationship between madness and philosophy? What is the relationship between the two such that it is possible for a text to occupy an indeterminate position between philosophical exposition and mad diary?

What makes this indeterminacy possible is that philosophy and madness are “after” the same thing. They share the same object and end: the supreme principle of reality; the structure of time, space, and persistence; the mystery of being and non-being; the incomprehensible glory of God. The difference is that the conventional philosopher approaches these problems in a detached, theoretical way. The mad person lives them. For the mad person, “solipsism” is not an abstract theory but a concrete manner of experiencing the world. For the mad, the very structure and integrity of the world may pivot on how we choose to interpret certain passages in Husserl, or Plotinus, or Charles Taylor.

Kusters makes no attempt to conceal his disruptive agenda. It is not primarily to contemplate, or even to represent, the relation between philosophy and madness. It is to enact this relationship. It is to lead the reader right up to the precipice of madness, and perhaps, right over it. Consider the passage on Husserl’s phenomenology of time (243–253). Kusters’ goal is not merely to relate the biographical fact that a careful study of Husserl led to an involuntary hospitalization (as in, “I was studying Husserl one day, and then things got a bit out of hand, and then the ambulance arrived”). Rather, it is to demonstrate to the reader precisely how the study of Husserl’s writings on time can precipitate a psychotic episode.

The problem has to do with Husserl’s reckless use of water metaphors, the most pertinent being the stream. Time consciousness, Husserl tells us, is like a flowing stream, with its facets of retention and protention smuggled into the present moment. But now that Husserl has opened the door to the casual use of water metaphors, what stops us from having a bit of fun, and deploying other metaphors? If we were careful and thorough in this procedure, we would likely alter the temporal structure of experience. Instead of a lazy stream, why not experience time as a raging river, which accelerates and decelerates unpredictably? Or a gentle pond which allows you to move effortlessly in any direction? Or for that matter, a whirlpool, where past and future merge and where one is violently wrenched out of a shared reality? How can anybody read Husserl thoughtfully and carefully and stay sane?

Kusters’ book is dangerous not only for one’s “mental health,” whatever that might amount to. It is dangerous for the profession of philosophy—for the conventions that govern the way we produce and discuss philosophical texts, its roles and its rules. Consider how the norms of our discipline dictate that an essay review of this sort should have a certain expository structure: there should be some introductory remarks about the grand design of the book, followed by a summary of its contents, followed by a “critique.” But how is an essayist to summarize a book that is incompressible? It would be like attempting to write a Cliffs Notes version of Schreber’s Memoirs of My Nervous Illness, or Burton’s The Anatomy of Melancholy. And how would one “critique” such a book? For a critique presupposes that the author’s purpose is to represent this thing, this phenomenon, called “madness,” in a faithful way. My job, then, in crafting an essay review, would be to reprimand the author: to show how the author has depicted madness falsely, or deployed a flawed methodology for “getting at” the truth of madness. But the book does not merely purport to represent madness. It purports to instantiate madness, to spread madness evenly across its pages, as one might spread feces across the wall of an isolation cell. It is a discourse on madness that always, and by necessity, exceeds its stated purpose of representing the phenomenon of madness—which, in the end, is a way of pointing to the nature of madness. One does not “critique” such a book. One either disengages with the book, or one tumbles into it. There is no third option.

Still, for the sake of preserving philosophical convention, I will say a word about the book’s overall structure and composition.

The book unfolds like a living organism. It is divided into four parts that correspond to the four elements of the ancient Greek world: earth, water, air, and fire. Each of the four parts consists of four chapters, along with some scattered intermezzos. The first part stays fairly close to conventional philosophical exposition, mad diaries notwithstanding. (This is appropriate enough, given that the first part is meant to correspond to earth—we remain on relatively familiar, solid terrain.) It constitutes a phenomenological description of the basic structures of the mad world. The psychotic world as a whole can be more real, or less real, than the sane world. Along with variations in the intensity of realness, the relation between the inner and outer world becomes loose, penetrable. The mad person’s thoughts can be displayed on a billboard for all to see, and others can project thoughts into her mind. Time can become parceled out into a string of disconnected moments that she can literally walk through. The foreground-background structure of space is flattened or reversed. Portals open and close in the mad person’s living room.

The first chapter, in particular, contains a rather brilliant analysis of how the world as a whole can toggle ceaselessly between being more real and less real. For one in the grips of psychosis, everything has a secret meaning. A string of letters and numbers on a license plate is a commentary on a current event, one that is corroborated, or humorously contradicted, by the color of a passerby’s shirt. Nothing happens by accident. Hence, a heightened sense of reality and expectation permeates the entirety of one’s experience. Yet this heightened sense of reality can be converted, almost instantaneously, into a sense of unreality. For if the world is so intricately arranged that every detail in my surroundings is dripping with symbolic meaning, then clearly, someone or something must have designed this world, down to that last detail, as a message to me. But then, the world itself is nothing but a theatrical production of the master designer, a Truman-Show-type artifice. It becomes far less real than the real world “behind” it. I must then perform various symbolic operations in order to get to that other world.

The book’s second part, corresponding to water, traces parallels between madness and mysticism. Mysticism and madness both begin with detachment: in mysticism, detachment from one’s goals and ambitions; in madness, detachment from a shared reality. The allure of mental imagery can become a serious obstacle to both the mystical and the mad journey; hence we must part ways with imagery. The confrontation with the ineffable problematizes our relation to language. Either the mad person must choose to remain mute, or, if compelled to speak, they must parody language mercilessly with puns, associations, double entendres, and secret codes, which the inattentive doctor will hastily dismiss as “word salad.” The final step in the journey is a break with “thought,” and a plunge, or rebirth, into the world.

If the book’s second part depicts the journey of madness, the third part, corresponding to air, depicts its goal (though we must recognize that these terms, “goal” and “journey,” are often reversible, or two aspects of the same movement). Our journey culminates with an encounter with a supreme principle of existence, not merely in a cerebral way, but in a profound, experiential way. But this supreme principle can be construed in at least four different ways: the object of my mystical reverie can be construed as the One, as existence as such, as infinity, or as nothingness. Each form of mystical ecstasy has its corresponding form of madness.

In the first, described by Plotinus, the mind attains to the One, a being that differs from all existing beings in that it is the ground of all being. The mad mystic often describes this as a breathtaking vision of the unity of all things. Separation and division appear as artificial or illusory. A second form of mysticism/madness takes as its object not a transcendent One, but existence as such: a doorknob, a fingernail, a piece of paper. The mad mystic forms an exhilarating and almost visceral impression of the existence of these objects. Their thatness comes to life as a distinctive quality. Drugs like mescaline or LSD seem almost tailor-made to induce this appreciation of the magic of existence. A third form of mysticism/madness is triggered by careful rumination on infinity, whether the abstract infinity of number, as in Cantor, or the actual infinity of God, as in Nicholas of Cusa. The infinite calls the mind right to the uttermost limit of thought, and slightly beyond it. The rapture of contemplating the infinity of God can, however, be transformed, at any moment, into terror in the face of an infinite abyss. The incomprehensibility of the infinite thus leads, ultimately, to the opening out of the nothingness. This nothingness is not simply the negation or absence of some existing thing—think Sartre’s Pierre. It is a nothingness beyond negation, a nothingness that stands on its own two feet.

In the book’s fourth and final part, corresponding to fire, the mad mystic’s exalted state is fractured; Icarus plunges back to earth. When the infinite is squeezed into the finite, the world shatters into contradictory bits. We survey the sobering consequences of these experiences. Some attempt, unsuccessfully, to wrap their heads around the paradoxes they’ve encountered: between timeless and temporal, self and other, divine and secular. (Consider the “atemporal temporality” of God’s existence, hotly contested among the philosophers of religion.) When the encounter with ultimate reality is severed, the sacred is born. The mad world is permeated by the sacred: everyday objects are invested with holiness, power, and moral value. In this respect, the mad person may come to inhabit Charles Taylor’s pre-secular, enchanted world. The One, intellectually fragmented, can be reorganized into an intricate intellectual structure in which every event has a meaning and a place: the Plan. In some cases, the Plan includes a space for a malicious other, and the mad person becomes the unlikely hero of a drama of persecution.

So much for the synopsis.

Now we have reached the point in an essay review where it is conventional to criticize the book. But, as I indicated, the possibility of a critique is undermined by the excessive character of the text. If the author’s goal were merely to depict madness faithfully, I could correct him on this point or that (“no, you see, madness is not quite like that; it’s a bit more like this”); but representing madness is not the book’s only, or even its primary, goal. Hence, to criticize Kusters’ book would be to participate in a system of thinking that the book decisively rejects. My remarks here should, consequently, be considered equally excessive: they are merely thoughts provoked by a reading of the book, and that may, in turn, provoke new ones. These thoughts pertain to two topics that the book does not take up in any systematic detail, which I will call the historical and institutional character of madness.

1. The historical character of madness. Madness has a history. When I say this, I do not mean what historians of psychiatry typically mean: that there is a history of how sane people have conceptualized mad people, that madness is conceived differently in different times and places (e.g., in one era, the mad were charges of the family; in another, they were charges of the state; in another, they formed communities and survivor networks). What I mean is that madness itself has a history, as Foucault surmised: it is like a species, or an organism. Its history is internal to it. Madness changes in its inmost character from generation to generation. Any attempt to describe madness is, as a consequence, necessarily partial and incomplete, for it chases after a moving target. And this is as it should be, for this historically mutable character underwrites its oft-remarked elusive nature.

Consider a specific example of the historical character of madness. In the eighteenth century, madness was overt. It was, as Porter (1987, 35) describes it, “publicly transparent,” a question of “behaving crazy, looking crazy, talking crazy.” In the nineteenth century, thanks to the era of mass institutionalization, madness became covert. A certain kind of madness, one that is preoccupied with conspiracies and intrigues, with the frantic production of chronicles, with seeking patterns in newspapers and radio broadcasts, quite literally came into being. The looming threat of institutionalization not only changed the way the sane relate to the mad, but the nature of madness itself.

In light of this changed character, the physician’s job changed accordingly. The role of the physician was no longer merely to treat madness, but to expose madness, to puncture the mad person’s semblance of sanity. This role, in turn, prompted a new paradox, one that preoccupied the great thinkers of madness of the nineteenth century: how is it that the mad person can dissemble reason while not, herself, being reasonable? How is she able to feign reasonableness without possessing reason? Madness became imbued with the character of fraudulence (Garson 2022, Chapter 6). That madness became “covert,” that the mad person became obsessed with a totalizing plan, that she had to conceal her mad musings under pain of confinement, that the physician had to expose her fraudulence: this represents a specific phase in the evolution of madness, one made possible by the historically contingent event of mass institutionalization. 

The historical character of madness points us to a second feature.  

2. The institutional character of madness. The relationship between madness, and the institutions designed to punish, confine, or reform the mad, is not an external one. Madness carries, deep inside of it, a stamp of its changing institutional character. We can exhibit the intrinsic institutional character of madness by posing a simple question: who, precisely, has the authority to write a book on the philosophy of madness? When I ask this question, I don’t mean: who is authorized to write a book about madness, that is, one that is designed to accurately “represent the phenomenon” of madness? Anybody with appropriate philosophical training, and a collection of facts of a more-or-less empirical nature, possesses the authority to write such a book. What I mean is: who, precisely, is authorized to write a book about madness from madness? Who is permitted to write a book that exceeds the representational character of a conventional research monograph in order to instantiate madness, to release madness into the world, as one might release a cage full of bats? Clearly, only the mad person is authorized to write such a book—or the one who has been mad at one point or another, or the one who has, say, through drugs, or ecstatic states of consciousness, tasted madness.

But how would one determine who, in fact, is mad? How shall I go about obtaining, if you will, a certificate of authenticity to write such a book? To put it provocatively, how can I be confident that the author of this very treatise is, in fact, mad, or has at one point of his life been mad, or has taken drugs that faithfully mimic the experience of madness? How do I know that the author is not, in reality, a sane person who is just trying to dupe the reader about the nature of madness, for the sake of a joke, or of a wager? How do I know, in short, that the author is not a fraud?

Only this: that such a person has an institutional stamp of approval: they have undergone a rigorous initiation into an institutional system designed to proffer psychiatric care. Such an initiation may include (a) an official diagnosis, by a qualified medical authority, of a serious mental illness; (b) the prescription, by an approved medical authority, of one or more psychotropic medications; (c) a psychiatric hospitalization, voluntary or otherwise; (d) possession of the sorts of experiences (thoughts, feelings, actions) that would, under ordinary circumstances, prompt one or more of the above. This is what I mean when I say that the institutional character of madness is not a nebulous “outside”; it exists within the pulsing heart of madness, as its guarantor and underwriter.

In short, this is a book that fundamentally transforms the philosophical study of madness. Anyone with a philosophical interest in topics such as reality, knowledge, and the mind, should own this book, partly for the way it reveals the systematic oversights that we, as philosophers, habitually bring to bear on these topics. It goes without saying that the book is essential reading for philosophers of psychiatry and psychology. Among other things, it heralds a new way of “doing” the philosophy of psychiatry. Much of the literature in the field consists in philosophizing about madness from the standpoint of sanity. It consists in this: an author who is (presumptively) sane, who wishes to inform us about the nature of madness (“mental illness,” “mental disorder”), and whose legacy will be judged, in the end, by whether they have accurately or inaccurately represented the object of their inquiry. What Kusters’ book makes clear to us is that this very approach is quite likely to distort the subject matter that it seeks to reveal, partly by reducing madness to an interesting phenomenon that one is supposed to describe, study, classify, and perhaps even “treat.”


Garson, J. 2022. Madness: A Philosophical Exploration. New York: Oxford University Press.

Porter, R. 1987. Mind Forg’d Manacles: A History of Madness in England from the Restoration to the Regency. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press