A Philosophy of Material Culture: Action, Function, and Mind

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Beth Preston, A Philosophy of Material Culture: Action, Function, and Mind, Routledge, 2012, 264pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415623087.

Reviewed by Barry Allen, McMaster University


Material culture is a name for the whole range of material interactions by which culture is effective, everything through which culture works. Some philosophers would call that technology, or simply artifacts, but Preston calls it material culture, a usage relatively unfamiliar among philosophers but sometimes followed in archaeology and anthropology.

One point Preston makes is that almost any use of artifacts is to some degree collaborative. Crusoe is a terrible model for thinking about artifacts and our interaction with them. Even if a person acts in relative isolation, whatever he interacts with, any artifacts in play almost certainly trace their genesis back to vast economies of collaboration. Collaborative action does not merely aggregate individual intentions. Preston draws no sharp line between individual and collaborative action, and even suggests that all human action is covertly social. She calls collaboration "the most concrete manifestation of human sociality."

Although the topics she discusses and the conclusions she defends may interest a wider readership, her preferred audience is analytic philosophers, especially writers on theory of action and function. Preston identifies three problems with current theory of action. One is the focus on individuals. Her thesis on collaboration overcomes what is wrong with that: material culture is typically both produced and used collaboratively. The second problem follows from concentrating on intentional action, especially planned action, to the neglect of improvisation, which tends to become literally unthinkable. Against this equation of action with the execution of a plan, Preston argues that improvisation cannot be eliminated or reduced to some kind of routine. Its anarchic presence has to be considered at every level of action. The third problem is a tendency to neglect the creativity of skilled action, to think that at some level any action reduces to routines, with creativity limited to how these routines are put together in a plan. However, the creativity of skill is just the other side of improvisation. All skilled action is at some level improvised, and the creativity of skilled action is to be good at improvising in some art. Effortless improvisational creativity distinguishes skilled action from the "brittleness that still plagues artificial intelligence systems."

Preston's book is one long argument against the valorization of intention, its priority over the artifact, and the assumption that a purely mental creativity, a plan or design, controls our interaction with material culture. She has many pages of careful argument against the putative priority of intentions over artifacts. To philosophers (ranging from Aristotle to Comte, Marx, and Collingwood) who think this way and nearly all current action theorists, the plan, the design, the idea, or intention is everything. Preston calls such thinking Centralized Control. The planner is the master of an idea, creating the form or design, the material realization of which is an action or artifact, either being items of material culture in Preston's sense. It is Centralized Control that makes improvisation really unthinkable. When action implies intention and intention implies plan, then all action is planned and truly improvised action is unthinkable. She shows action theorists pathetically driven to invoke near-instantaneous ("the speed of thought") formulations of ever new plans, as the busy little planner in Central Control tries to keep up.

Centralized Control is not merely unattainable in practice. It is a false ideal. If we really lived up to it, action would routinely fail because the flexibility to accommodate problematic contingencies and exploit serendipitous opportunities would be compromised. It would eliminate everything artful about the arts. Action would become robotic and "brittle," as skill never is. All kinds of action go forward flawlessly without planning, and the part of action that really is planned typically involves a mix of pre-specified acts interleaved with episodes of sometimes extensive and multilayered improvisation.

Rather than depict material culture as arising from the plans and intentions of autonomous individuals, Preston investigates how plans and intentions arise from the contexts and artifacts of material culture. The constraints and structures of material culture enable individual activity without compromising creativity. Few of the characteristics that distinguish individuals can be understood without reference to the social conditions of their genesis. Competent individuals are made, not born. Intentions and plans are among the effects of material culture, not the cause, a view she shares with "Wittgensteinians" and "pretty much the entire community of philosophers on the Continent for the last century or so," including Michel Foucault, Pierre Bourdieu, and Bruno Latour. The current of Individualism among Anglophone philosophers has made them miss these supposedly important developments in Europe. Richard Rorty made the same argument in his effort to update pragmatism.

There is a whole second side to Preston's book. Her points about action theory are directed at interaction with artifacts. What about the artifacts themselves? What is an artifact and what makes it so functional?

There is a tendency, which Preston does not resist, to think that artifacts have functions in something like the way the organs of an organism have functions, and that artifacts even acquire these functions in something like the way Darwinists think organs do, by some technological analogue of natural selection. Spelling out this hunch can be difficult, and there is a substantial philosophical literature addressing the issues. The two poles of this discourse on function in Anglophone philosophy are Ruth Millikan and Robert Cummins. Millikan thinks artifacts have "proper function," and get it much as organs get natural function, by a kind of selection. Cummins drops the idea of proper function, and explains functions as an effect of being part of a system. Things have functions not proper to themselves, but only as parts in a larger system. Preston thinks we do not have to choose between these two types of theory, that both address different aspects of artifactual function, with no logical obstacle to combining them. Curiously she says nothing to skeptics of artifact function, who sometimes go so far as to deny any function to artifacts or systems of artifacts whatsoever. Functions arise when artifacts are enrolled in action, and then they have any function people find them useful for. What tends to be characteristic of artifacts from this point of view is not function but functionless functionality.

Intentions are not the source of most action, and also not the source of function for artifacts. Preston calls the idea that artifacts get their function from a maker's intention "an intuition that has become a commonplace," but also "a mare's nest of loose ends and little-recognized problems." One problem is simply whose intention? The designer, the producer, or the user? These are different, and may even conflict. Another problem is which intention? Most interaction with artifacts is collaborative, with no master intention. She blurs the once stark distinction between growing and making, drawing appreciatively on the work of anthropologist Tim Ingold. The causes of organic structure (growth) are no less than interaction with an entire ecology (which ecology becomes what Ingold calls a morphogenetic field), and the same thing applies to making, or material culture. The role of intention and representation in making is exaggerated, and the value of skilled movement underappreciated. For Ingold, skills belong to whole human ecologies, much as the psychologist of vision James Gibson argued that there is no central visual system short of the whole ecology of the visual organism.

Preston has a nice discussion of a point almost no one else raises. It is simply routine to use artifacts in non-standard ways. If artifacts have functions, people are curiously indifferent to them when they reach for a tool. It is risible to think there is some propriety for the usage of turning screws that inheres in the screwdriver as its function. This tool is a perfect example to show that an artifact is good for anything anyone can do well with it. That seems to abolish proper function, though Preston won't draw that conclusion. Instead, she dutifully tries to accommodate the "intuition" that there is a technical propriety in the use of artifacts, functions that are, somehow, theirs, in them, true of them, based in their technicality or technical form.

Preston has a good analysis of the roots of what she calls non-standard use. One component is the multiple realizability of functions: intended use constrains but does not determine artifactual structure. Another component is the multiple utilizability of structures: structure constrains but does not determine use. Combine these and the use of any artifact is functionally underdetermined and structurally constrained. Not every artifact can be well used for just any purpose, but rare is the artifact that cannot be used for an open-ended multiplicity of purposes. As Preston notes, psychologists treat the ability to think of new, non-standard uses as a test of creativity, and non-proper use is learned by children simultaneously with learning proper use. The result of this ambivalent training is ambivalently skilled adults. We encounter artifacts already endowed with function by the people with whom we interact as infants and children, and whose material culture we imitate. The non-standard use of material culture is so natural because a non-standard use of the hands is standard, and the most useful thing a hand can do is use a tool.

I think this would be a good book for archaeologists and anthropologists interested in theory to struggle with. Preston is a diligent dialectician in the manner of contemporary analytic philosophy. It would also be a good book for the philosophers of technology and the theory of action (although one would hope less of a struggle). Her argument suggests connections with the Extended Mind hypothesis in the theory of cognition, and with Bruno Latour's Actor-Network methodology.