A Philosophy of Tragedy

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Christopher Hamilton, A Philosophy of Tragedy, Reaktion, 2016, 174pp., $22.50 (pbk), ISBN 9781780235899.

Reviewed by Richard Eldridge, Swarthmore College


This is a curious book: humane, decent, gracefully written, and full of learning, but not exactly a contribution to a distinct domain of academic research. As Hamilton emphasizes, it is more an informed meditation on or gesture toward the difficulties of self-knowledge and of comprehensive moral and political knowledge and achievement than it is an argument from putatively undisputed premises that seeks to convince anyone of the truth of its central claims in relation to an academic Fach. In many respects, it resembles Hamilton's earlier How to Deal with Adversity (2014) and Middle Age (2014), though it is somewhat darker in tone. Its main theme is the omnipresence of both suffering and dissatisfaction in human life; its central aim is "to capture something like a central perspective on tragedy as it has been explored in philosophy, literature, and life" (p. 13). Auden and Nietzsche are the most frequently cited authors. Somewhat surprisingly, Schopenhauer and Beckett (except within a cited remark by John Calder) are not mentioned, and Freud is cited only once.

Hamilton treats the classic so-called paradox of tragedy­ -- why do we enjoy representations of horrible things?­­ -- by suggesting, following Nietzsche, that we may resonate to the glories of poetic language and take comfort in "an illusion about the nature and value of suffering" as somehow ennobling or educative (p. 78). But his larger argument focuses more on tragic suffering within ordinary life than on artistic representations. Here his central claim is that it is obvious on the face of it, as well as driven home more dramatically by Auschwitz, that there is a great deal of suffering in ordinary life that "is sometimes, perhaps often or even always, simply banal or squalid or futile or just plain awful" (p. 76). Christianity rightly registers this fact, while offering a solution in which we can no longer believe. "The Christian diagnosis of our [broken, divided] condition is correct but its redemptive power is exhausted" (p. 55). In light of the wretched facts of ordinary life, grandly horrific or banal, as well as of Darwinism, historicism, and a general sense of the disenchantment of the world, we should simply accept that "the human condition is tragic" and that "human beings are not at home in the world" (p. 3).

Not only Christianity, but also most explanation-seeking religion, metaphysics, and philosophy amount to nothing more than "elaborate system[s] of denial about the truth of our condition" (p. 10). Philosophy, for example, "wants things to make sense, and tragedy says that they do not" (p. 121). In general, human beings, thrown into inevitable suffering and caught between conflicting needs for both peace, harmony, and security, on the one hand, and activity, movement, and disruptive animation of interest, on the other (p. 42), are prone to indulge in illusions about possibilities of living well. ("It just is part of our condition as [suffering and self-divided] human beings to wish to escape that condition" [p. 30]). We ordinarily know what we're doing -- feeding the cat, painting the house, or writing a book review, say -- but also fail to know our most fundamental motivations in living within illusions about possibilities of happiness and meaning (p. 45). In fact, we all do or should realize that "our life has become hopelessly compromised" (p. 43) and that, as T. S. Eliot put it, "the best of a bad job is all any of us make of it" (cited, p. 116).

We might hope at least to identify skills and virtues for coping comparatively well with our situation. But while there are sometimes relevant skills and virtues available within particular contexts, there is no general, objective story that can be told about virtue in general. The virtues are significantly plural, contextual, and fundamentally conflicting, so that any general story will inappropriately overvalue some virtues and undervalue others. One might hope to do better by describing a specific form of social or political life that required a specific set of virtues, but this would require "a justification for a particular political system" (p. 103) that it is impossible to provide, and in any case "virtues and vices differ only in degree" (131), since your humility may be my lack of daring, my insight your fanaticism.

Overall, I am sympathetic with the broad idea of philosophy, or at least philosophy that is concerned with norms and values, as at bottom a matter of partial vision achieved under the acknowledgment of the darkness and disenchantment of nature. Arguably, it is impossible for us to construct a fully good and fully stable social world, its value vouchsafed by disinterested arguments from nowhere. Acceptance of suffering, partiality of achievement, and a need for ongoing social criticism and self-criticism are in order, as numbers of figures, including Freud, Wittgenstein, Rorty, Cavell, and Geuss, have urged. But how fully dark should our acceptance of these ideas be? Hamilton suggests that we must somehow find some sort of orientation amidst suffering, if we are to get on with our lives decently well. "If we are to make something of our life, then we need to find some kind of place, not too indecorous, between an honest recognition of the tragedy of our suffering, failure, confusion, and homelessness, on the one hand, and the tragedy of living a lie, on the other" (p. 157). Yet he offers little about how to do this, and he also asks whether "ill-health [living in resentment and depression] [is] the price we have to pay for a true [illusion-free, non-complacent] grasp on reality" (p. 53), and it is not clear that his answer is No. Here Hamilton's dark realism about the achievement of valuable lives may block him from more fully articulating some modest possibilities that may be in view. As Freud is said to have remarked, the task of psychoanalysis is to enable human beings "to work and to love" in good-enough ways while accepting the standing discontents of civilization and ego-formation under antagonisms. Contra Hamilton, it is not clear that it is metaphysically impossible for most human beings to do this.

More specifically, ethically we might hope to construct some good-enough personal relations that embody genuine love, intimacy, wit, and fun, as Cavell as argued in describing how the principal pairs in comedies of remarriage achieve an erotic friendship of virtue,[1] or as Alexander Nehamas has recently understood friendship.[2] Human life might have its loves and comedies as well as its sufferings and tragedies. Politically, we might hope to construct a non-triumphalist liberal order that distributed relatively equally well, albeit imperfectly, chances for the construction of a meaningful life. One would have thought that the whole point of political liberalism from Kant and Mill to Rawls and Habermas was the reasonable construction of institutions that further diverse individual pursuits of meaning precisely in the absence of specific knowledge of the good for human beings as such. More broadly, David Wiggins has usefully reminded us that we might address, if not solve, problems of meaning in life by taking meaning to be always partly immanent in life, thence working conversationally with others both "down from point to the human activities that answer to it, and up from activities whose intrinsic worth can be demonstrated by Aristotle's consensual method to forms of life in which we are capable by nature of finding point."[3] In general, as Hamilton urges, we would do well to reject triumphalism, hubris, and claims to finality, and it is good to be reminded of this. But even if there is a storm driving the angel of history backwards out of paradise and piling up the debris of civilizations at its feet, we might hope reasonably to navigate a number of modest courses somewhat more successfully and clear-sightedly than Hamilton quite brings into view.

[1] Stanley Cavell, Pursuits of Happiness: The Hollywood Comedy of Remarriage (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1981).

[2] Alexander Nehamas, On Friendship (New York: Basic Books, 2016).

[3] David Wiggins, "Truth, Invention and the Meaning of Life," reprinted in Wiggins, Needs, Values, Truth: Essays in the Philosophy of Value, 3d. ed. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998), pp. 87-138 at p. 134.