A Physicalist Manifesto: Thoroughly Modern Materialism

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Melnyk, Andrew, A Physicalist Manifesto: Thoroughly Modern Materialism, Cambridge University Press, 2003, 340pp, $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521827116.

Reviewed by D. Gene Witmer , University of Florida


Andrew Melnyk has thrown down the gauntlet. With the publication of this extraordinarily systematic and lucid book, those philosophers skeptical about the possibility of a clear, significant, and plausible physicalist thesis face a formidable challenge. . Physicalist Manifesto provides unprecedented depth and detail to three central questions faced by any would-be physicalist. How should the doctrine be formulated? What does it imply about reductionism or, more generally, the status of the sciences outside of physics? And, of course: What sort of evidence can be brought to bear on the question of its truth?

These three questions are neatly addressed in two chapters each. The first two chapters (“Realization Physicalism” and “Why Not Supervenience?”) are devoted to the formulation question; we are given a canonical statement of the thesis and an argument for preferring it to one that makes use of the notion of supervenience. The third and fourth (“Realizationism and R*d*ct**n*sm” and “Causation and Explanation in a Realizationist World”) focus on the consequences of physicalism, arguing that the doctrine indeed implies a kind of reductionism, but one that is free from damaging commitments; in particular, Melnyk argues that he can accommodate without compromise the causal role of the nonphysical. The last two chapters (“The Evidence against Realization Physicalism” and “The Evidence for Realization Physicalism”) argue that the balance of evidence is nearly all on one side: there is no significant evidence against the doctrine and extensive evidence for it. The entirety of the book displays an impressive degree of unity. Insights that appear briefly in one chapter are shown to ramify in a helpful way in later chapters; arguments in one chapter may rely on a promissory note that is fully redeemed in a later chapter. I venture to predict that Melnyk’s “manifesto” will find many signatories among contemporary physicalists.

Now let us turn to some details. Melnyk’s “realization physicalism” (“realizationism” for short) can be roughly expressed as the claim that all actual tokens (all particular objects, events, and property instances) are either physical or physically realized. The notion of realization is explained by reference to functional types, where a type F is functional when there is some condition C associated with F such that, necessarily, F is tokened iff there exists some token of another type T that meets condition C. To say that a token x realizes a token y of type F is then to say that x is of some type that meets condition C, resulting in the existence of y.

What, then, is it to say that a given token y is physically realized? A natural suggestion is that y is physically realized iff it is realized by x, where x is itself physical. But this is insufficient. Suppose y is a token of F realized by x by virtue of x’s being of physical type P; what makes it the case that x realizes a token of F is the fact that P meets the associated condition for F. That condition might, however, itself be hostile to physicalism, even if it is a condition satisfied by a physical type. As Melnyk puts it, “[i]f the obtaining of these conditions is not itself a physical or physically realized affair (e.g., perhaps their obtaining requires the presence in Australia of five angels), then the functional token may be realized by an entirely law-abiding token of a physical type, but still fail, intuitively, to be realized by the physical” (23).

Physicalism plainly needs to be formulated in a way that rules out the imagined situation. It may be possible to get this result, though, without resorting to a more elaborate definition of “physically realized.” If the physicalist claims that all actual tokens are physically realized, then the scenario is ruled out by virtue of the fact that the five angels are themselves actual tokens that fail to be either physical or realized by anything physical. The scenario would then be ruled out not by means of what is implied by saying that this particular token of F is physically realized but by means of the generality of the physicalist thesis itself. It should be noted, though, that Melnyk doesn’t make the thesis perfectly general; those actual tokens that fail to be either contingent or causal are excluded, as well as those that are of types “partially constituted by absences” (26).

In any case, Melnyk opts to define “physically realized” in the following fashion:

A token x of a functional type, F, is physically realized iff (i) x is realized by a token of some physical type, T, and (ii) T meets the associated condition for F solely as a logical consequence of the distribution in the world of physical tokens and the holding of physical laws. (23)

The problematic scenario is here ruled out by means of clause (ii). It should be stressed that this definition of “physically realized” implies what some may find an uncomfortably strong consequence, namely, that every functional type capable of such realization must be itself expressible in physical and quasi-logical terms (25). If realizationism is true, then, we could describe (nearly) every type of thing there actually is in the world using purely physical and quasi-logical language. Such commitments may prompt one to hope that a weaker formulation of physicalism can be found.

Melnyk’s second chapter is devoted to showing that this hope cannot be satisfied by appeal to supervenience. His claim is not that no supervenience formulation of physicalism is adequate; his claim, rather, is that no adequate supervenience formulation can avoid the “strong and perhaps offensively reductionist commitments” of realization physicalism (50). Melnyk’s generally persuasive arguments for this claim turn largely on the following point. If we say that nonphysical properties supervene on physical properties, this supervenience claim by itself fails to imply that the distribution of nonphysical properties is to be explained by the physical facts. The necessitation of the nonphysical may be merely brute necessitation. An adequate formulation of physicalism must imply that the necessitation is appropriately subject to explanation. The burden of Melnyk’s argument is then to show that accommodating such an explanatory component will require commitments that are just as strong as those the philosopher wary of “reductionist commitments” wants to avoid.

While I expect Melnyk is right about this, there remains a good question as to whether a supervenience formulation constructed to accommodate the explanatory requirement may be weaker than a realizationist formulation in a way that makes it preferable on grounds other than some nebulous fear of reductionism. Perhaps one would prefer a truly minimal formulation. At one point, in fact, Melnyk considers a formulation that seems designed for just this purpose; he considers a proposal to formulate physicalism as the conjunction of some supervenience thesis with the denial that the necessitation is brute (69). The substantive issue is then whether it is possible for there to be non-brute necessitation of the right sort that doesn’t imply realizationism, regardless of whether it implies reductionism.

But what does reductionism come to anyway? Melnyk tackles this important question in the third chapter, refusing to take for granted that the notion is transparent. Instead, he takes the time to disentangle several distinct interpretations, noting that the term has been sufficiently abused that in some quarters it is practically a dirty word -- hence the “r*d*ct**n*sm” of the title. From this survey he extracts what he calls “reductionism in the core sense,” which is essentially a claim about explanation:

(CR) All nomic special- and honorary-scientific facts, and all positive nonnomic special and honorary-scientific facts, have an explanation that appeals only to (i) physical facts and (ii) necessary (i.e. entirely noncontingent) truths. (83)

(By “special and honorary-scientific facts” he means “facts expressible in the proprietary vocabularies of the special and honorary sciences”.) Realizationism does imply CR, he argues, but the commitment does not render the doctrine implausible, as CR itself implies less than you might think.

It is one of the considerable merits of the book that it shows how one could be a reductionist in the sense of CR without being a reductionist in other senses that may be thought problematic. Worries about the methodological implications of reductionism, the relevance of multiple realizability, the autonomy of the special sciences, and so on -- these are all dispatched in a satisfying fashion. One of the best known of these worries is that reductionism may imply that the only legitimate causal explanations are physical, that the nonphysical ends up being in some way epiphenomenal. This worry is sufficiently important that the entirety of the fourth chapter is devoted to its relief.

Melnyk pursues two major tasks in that chapter. First, he offers a diagnosis of the fear of epiphenomenalism, arguing persuasively that it arises primarily because of a failure to attend to the difference between a situation in which a nonphysical property is nomically linked to an underlying physical property and one in which the nonphysical property is linked to a physical property by the realization relation and is, thereby, not entirely distinct from it. Second, he offers a full-fledged theory of causation and causal explanation, the details of which can be used to demonstrate that realization physicalism is consistent with nonphysical causation. The theory on offer is a version of regularity theory whereby two events are causally related when subsumed by a logically contingent regularity. Instead of appealing to the simplicity or informativeness of some overall theory (in the style of Lewis), he simply defines a “cause-constituting” regularity in a negative fashion. A regularity is by default sufficient to render events subsumed by it causally related; it only fails to be cause-constituting if a certain kind of explanation of its truth -- an “undercutter” -- is available, where an undercutter makes the regularity look like a coincidence. Melnyk can then show that realization physicalism does not imply that nonphysical regularities have such undercutters; since nothing more than lacking an undercutter is needed for a regularity to confer genuine causal relations, nonphysical events can be causally related simply by being subsumed under a regularity.

If Melnyk’s theory is correct, it is quite clear that realizationism is consistent with nonphysical causation; unfortunately, the theory on offer may be as controversial as physicalism itself. Here, I think, he will find most dissent from fellow physicalists -- including myself. For it seems to me that the motivations for any regularity theory of causation are at odds with the scientific realism presumed by any physicalism. Physicalists can have no epistemic qualms about going beyond the observable to the merely theoretical. But the only serious motivation for adopting a regularity theory of causation, so far as I can see, is a fear of going beyond the observable: since we don’t observe the causal relation between events, we have no evidence for positing anything other than regularities.

While I am unsympathetic with regularity theories of causation, I find Melnyk’s development of that approach rather ingenious; its strength lies in its promise to accommodate the persistent intuition that any given regularity may be “just a coincidence” by offering a plausible story about what, further, we are imagining when we imagine such a situation -- namely, that the regularity has an undercutter. Interestingly, his theory cannot accommodate the intuition that there could be a world in which every regularity is a coincidence, for the only way a regularity can fail to be cause-constituting is by there being an undercutter explanation of it -- which requires the existence of some other cause-constituting regularity.

We turn finally to the epistemic status of physicalism as addressed in the last two chapters. The reader might expect a sustained discussion of certain well-known modal or conceivability arguments for dualism; but in fact very little time is spent on these. Melnyk justifies the neglect on the grounds that a priori considerations are in principle incapable of casting doubt on realization physicalism. He says, simply, that “the reference of our concepts is not an a priori matter” (36). While such brusque treatment is bound not to convince anyone who gives weight to those arguments, its effect is to ensure that his critical discussion covers some less familiar but certainly important territory.

That territory ranges from the dualist arguments of the neuroscientist Sir John Eccles and “antireductionist” arguments from biologically informed philosophers (as well as from working scientists) to teleological arguments for theism and the significance of parapsychological research. One point that Melnyk invokes to good effect several times is that much of the evidence invoked in these arguments may be neutralized if the type of phenomena allegedly incapable of physical realization may be eliminated in favor of a suitably functionalist replacement.

One rather different sort of argument against physicalism turns on the familiar pessimistic historical induction regarding scientific theories: if we define the physical (as Melnyk does) by reference to current physical theory, that theory is likely false -- and, hence, physicalism itself is likely false. Melnyk’s response to the objection is to accept the conclusion: physicalism is likely false, but believing as much is consistent with adopting the same kind of attitude towards physicalism that working scientists adopt towards current scientific theories. This attitude is a kind of endorsement that requires holding that theory is more likely to be true than any of its relevant rivals, if not likely to be true simpliciter.

The appeal of this response lies in its treating the attitude of the physicalist towards his theory as on a par with that of the working scientist’s attitude towards current theories. Since we respect the scientist’s attitude, this respect carries over to the physicalist. One may wonder, though, whether this respect is sufficient to answer our worries. For it seems that the scientist herself faces what looks to be a philosophical puzzle: if you don’t think that the theory is likely true, just what do you think is likely true? Comparing the philosopher who endorses physicalism to the scientist may do something to show that the historical objection lacks the force some think it has, but it does not, I think, show that we have no important work to do in response. Aren’t we under some sort of obligation to say what it is we think, all things considered, is likely to be true?

The final chapter presents the positive evidence in favor of realizationism. That evidence is, for the most part, exhibited in the course of a series of inferences to the best explanation; the claim in each case is that the identification of a given apparently nonphysical type with either a physical or functional type of an appropriate sort best explains why the original type has the features it has. For example: identifying solidity with having one or another kind of physical structure enables us to explain such things as the fact that solids retain their shape in ordinary circumstances. We are treated to an overview of how this sort of argument can be applied at the level of mechanics, chemistry, biology, and so on; the cumulative effect is that we have wide-ranging inductive support for thinking that all actual tokens are physical or physically realized. The case of mental phenomena in particular is, though, rather different, for we lack the sort of detailed explanations that would justify such identifications. The evidence for realizationism about the mental, then, consists largely of other sorts of considerations familiar to philosophers -- primarily arguments from the causal interaction of the mental and the physical.

One especially useful point that Melnyk illustrates with several examples is the fact that things could have turned out quite differently, in a way inconsistent with physicalism; the fact, for instance, that chemical phenomena turned out to be explicable on the assumption that chemical elements are identifiable with physical structures is itself a striking fact, one we are apt to overlook given the philosopher’s typical focus on the mental alone. The significance of such facts is further highlighted by what Melnyk does earlier in response to the historical objection, namely, offer an articulation of the relevant rivals to physicalism. There are two such rivals: a kind of pluralist egalitarianism according to which no science is comprehensive and a traditional dualism, according to which physicalism is true for everything except the mental. The evidence assembled in the final chapter is intended to show how well physicalism fares compared to these competitors.

Among the many contributions this book makes to the literature, this last chapter is one of the most valuable. The last decade has seen philosophers begin to pay attention to the crucial question as to how physicalism may be justified, but there is nowhere else a systematic and detailed overview of the sort we have here. Indeed, this level of system and detail is demonstrated throughout the book. Melnyk’s Manifesto deserves to become the standard reference point for philosophers thinking about physicalism.