A Place for Consciousness: Probing the Deep Structure of the Natural World

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Gregg Rosenberg, A Place for Consciousness: Probing the Deep Structure of the Natural World, Oxford University Press, 2004, 344pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN: 0195168143.

Reviewed by Paul Skokowski, UC Berkeley, Stanford University


Rosenberg has an ambitious agenda in this book. First, he gives an argument that is intended to dispose of physicalism. Next, he gives a dual-aspect theory of the world that he defends as different from the standard alternatives to physicalism such as Cartesian dualism, epiphenomenalism, and so on. He calls this theory Liberal Naturalism: "Liberal Naturalism is the view that nature is built on a single fundamental kind, and, if so, that some aspects or properties of this fundamental natural kind are not physical."(77) Next, Rosenberg offers up a new theory of causation which he calls the theory of causal significance. This theory holds that causation doesn't just require effective properties, but also requires receptive properties -- and these latter properties are not addressed by physical theory. Along the way he offers thoughts and arguments on Hume, monads, Panexperientialism, and a variety of other topics too numerous to be covered in a short book review, and he concludes with some further thoughts on consciousness and what he offers as applications of these theories. The prospective reader should be warned that this book introduces a rather extensive new terminology which is (to say the least) difficult to follow, particularly in the latter half of the book, where new terms are introduced at a dizzying rate.

Materialists will be heartened to hear that Rosenberg's arguments against materialism come up short. Externalist materialism in particular escapes completely unscathed. Since I am of the externalist persuasion myself, I will tend to concentrate on how his arguments fail against this form of materialism. Though I won't argue it here, I am also confident that recent internalist formulations of materialism not addressed by Rosenberg (e.g., Perry 2001) are also immune to his arguments.

Rosenberg bases his argument against physicalism on a computer program known as Life. Life is a cellular automaton program, one that 'evolves' according to certain rules after being given initial conditions. Rosenberg argues that Life worlds are composed of mere digital differences -- the properties of such a world are just 'on' or 'off' properties. However, Rosenberg goes on to say, phenomenal contents, that is, experiences or qualia, such as the experiences of colors red and yellow "are not constituted by patterns of mere difference, without any content at all."(23) So something must be added to the Life world to account for such phenomenal content. Since the Life cellular automaton is all there is to this 'world', something must be added to the Life world (read: 'qualia') in order for that world to have phenomenal content.

Note that the claim here is not that Life is simulating, or comprising, a mind. The argument is, rather, that the digital program Life actually comprises a world. One problem with such a view is that computer programs just don't comprise actual, physical worlds. Which brings up the question: What can a computer program do with respect to an actual world -- a world like ours? The best a computer program can do with respect to the real world is to provide a simulation of it. Consider a free-electron laser, and a computer simulation of a free-electron laser. A free-electron laser contains relativistic free electrons, wiggler magnets, and coherent electromagnetic fields. But there are no electrons, wiggler magnets, or coherent electromagnetic fields in a digital simulation of a free electron laser. Similarly, we shouldn't expect to find phenomenal contents in a digital simulation of our world.

At one point Rosenberg appears to be arguing that the actual world is just a cellular automaton, but if this is his argument, he is providing us with shaky evidence. Here is an example: "Wolfram has reported results of his twenty-year study of cellular automata, arguing from a tremendous amount of data that understanding our world in terms of cellular automata throws light on fundamental and unsolved problems in almost every branch of science, including fundamental physics."(25) This is unconvincing. Maxwell's early understanding of electromagnetic phenomena in terms of gears and pulleys threw light on fundamental and unsolved problems in electromagnetism, and even led him to his famous equations, but this did not prove that electromagnetic phenomena were, or were even based on, gears and pulleys.

These points are important because it is Rosenberg's intention to extend his argument that there are no phenomenal contents in the Life world to the real physical world. As he puts it, "If a pure Life world cannot entail facts about phenomenal consciousness, then a pure physical world cannot entail facts about phenomenal consciousness."(25) Again, this is to say that if a digital simulation doesn't entail facts about consciousness, then the physical world doesn't entail facts about consciousness, but as we have seen in the above paragraphs, this just doesn't follow. But we can go further: consider materialist externalism. Here, an experience of red consists of an internal state (presumably in the visual cortex) which has as its content the color red -- a physical property in the world, viz., surface reflectance properties.(Tye 2000, Hilbert 1987) The 'red' here is not some epiphenomenal or non-physical property. It is an actual physical property of an external object; a property objectively measurable and explained by physical theory. And, most importantly, it is not 'a pattern of bare difference.' The Life world may not contain the experiential content red, but the physical world does.

Throughout the book, Rosenberg discusses what he calls the 'boundary problem': the need to explain why middle-level objects, such as human agents, or even neurons, are the kinds of things that have experiences. He sees this as a problem for science, because, ultimately, physical explanation only properly occurs at the level of the quantum mechanics of elementary particles and fields, or perhaps even at a smaller scale. And, he claims, consciousness can't be explained at this micro-level. But a materialist need not accept such an argument. Consider natural selection. A theory of natural selection assumes a physical story that underlies it and that can provide the mechanisms that do the causal work of the theory. We might, for example, postulate that there are things called genes even before we know anything about the internal chemistry of cells. Later, we find out that DNA plays the crucial causal role. What explains how DNA goes about its causal business? Chemistry. What explains the chemistry of DNA and other molecules? Physics, and in particular, quantum mechanics. So just because certain phenomena happen at a middle level (natural selection), we still rely on more fundamental theories to explain their constituents and their causal efficacy. And these fundamental theories do an admirable job.

Earlier I mentioned the theory of causal significance, which, according to Rosenberg, represents the deep structure of causation. This theory claims that causation in our world has at least two equally fundamental aspects: effective properties and receptive properties, and that the latter aspect of causation -- receptivity -- is left out of physical theory. But Rosenberg is wrong about this. A materialist could counter, if she were willing to consider using the causal language offered here, that receptivity, or receptive properties, indeed can be part of physics. Consider the theory of electromagnetism and Coulomb's law: only particles with the property of charge can be affected by other particles with the property of charge. Rosenberg makes the claim that in order for a given individual to be receptive, there must be conditions that selectively determine which individuals the given individual will be receptive to. We can think of electromagnetic fields as 'activating' (Rosenberg's term) the receptivity of remote particles. The 'conditions' are given by the theory of electromagnetism and its specification of fields. So here is an example of a physical theory, namely electromagnetism, with 'receptive properties', and appropriate 'activations' of the receptivities of remote particles. And all this is done with objective physical properties and an accepted and fundamental physical theory, without having to postulate any non-physical entities whatsoever.

Let me conclude by answering Rosenberg's criticisms of externalism, which he calls 'representationalism'. He says that such theories fail because they "… always appeal to the unexplained and previously rejected [in chapter 3] notion of metaphysical necessity to connect the intentional content of a representation to its qualitative character." The problem here is that Rosenberg's 'rejection' in chapter 3 was a rejection of internalism, not externalism. His argument in that chapter was against the mind-brain identity thesis. As he says in Chapter 3: "With this in mind, I can now state the most important conclusion of this subsection: Mind/brain identity is not a sufficient condition for the truth of physicalism."(59) And of course, the problem here is that externalists explicitly deny mind/brain identity! (Dretske 1995, Tye 1995) The mind is not identical with the brain under externalism. When Esmerelda experiences red, the experience of red is not contained in her head. Rather, there is an internal state (presumably in the visual cortex) which is the vehicle of the experience, and an external state, which is its content: for example the exemplification of a reflectance which is a particular shade of red, and which is itself a property of an external object being experienced, say a rose. The content of the internal experiential state -- the shade of red being experienced -- is external to the head. The experience of red is not, then, contained in the head. Rosenberg's arguments against physicalism are just arguments against internalism, and miss externalist formulations of materialism completely.


Dretske, Fred (1995), Naturalizing the Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Hilbert, D. (1987), Color and Color Perception: A Study in Anthropocentric Realism. Stanford: Center for the Study of Language and Information.

Perry, John (2001), Knowledge, Possibility, and Consciousness. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Tye, Michael (1995), Ten Problems of Consciousness. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Tye, Michael (2000), Consciousness, Color, and Content. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.