A Plea for Natural Philosophy: And Other Essays

Maddy Plea For Natural Philo

Penelope Maddy, A Plea for Natural Philosophy: And Other Essays, Oxford University Press, 2022, 313pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197508855.

Reviewed by Gary Hatfield, University of Pennsylvania


Over the past twenty-five years or so, Penelope Maddy has been developing a naturalistic position in the philosophy of mathematics and in philosophy of science more generally. Finding that “naturalism” has many aspects, including some she does not endorse or even address, she re-fashioned this project as something called “Second Philosophy,” as manifested by a figure dubbed “the Second Philosopher.” This project was the subject of her 2007 book, Second Philosophy: A Naturalistic Method. The Second Philosopher is someone “born native to our contemporary scientific world-view,” who “begins from common sense,” which means that “she trusts her perceptions, subject to correction.” Her curiosity about the world and her place in it leads her to develop more precise observations, purposeful experimentation, hypothesis testing, and “ever more comprehensive theories” (Second Philosophy, ch. 1, 14). The 2007 book characterizes the Second Philosopher in contrast with, or in connection with, various positions Maddy finds in Descartes, Cartesian skepticism, Hume, Kant, Carnap, Quine, and Putnam. Descartes allows her to define the basic characteristic of Second Philosophy: he made philosophy prior to science, or “first”; the Second Philosopher puts science first and philosophy second. Maddy then examines the relation to naturalism and Second Philosophy of the remaining figures, before applying the method of Second Philosophy to questions about truth and reference (viewed partly against the history of physics from mechanism to field theories), philosophy of logic, and philosophy of mathematics. Philosophical results arise from observing how the Second Philosopher responds to various positions and what attitudes she brings from her position “within science” (ibid., 15). Importantly, she does not simply defer to science but evaluates various claims for herself, using common sense and its extension in the methods of science.

In the years since, Maddy has revised and extended her position on the methodology and results of Second Philosophy by developing the persona of the Second Philosopher. The present volume collects six previously published pieces and five new ones (all written between 2010 and 2020), arranged under four headings.

I. Method: which is discussed as part of a “A Plea for Natural Philosophy” (I.1) that’s partly historical (e.g., as to primary and secondary qualities) and partly contemporary (e.g., as to such qualities today). She emphasizes that in the seventeenth century, “natural philosophy” was a practice that was the ancestor of natural science and which did not, in its day, draw a firm boundary between philosophy and science, a point supported by the fact that both Descartes, now primarily classified as a philosopher, and Newton, now seen as a scientist (physicist), each contributed to what was called natural philosophy. They set the example for thinkers who engage in empirical study but also examine fundamental notions, think about method, and frame new theoretical directions. The second paper in this section considers Realism as addressed by Bas van Fraassen and Kyle Stanford (I.2) as compared with Realism in Second Philosophy.

II. Skepticism: a paper on Hume and Reid (II.3) portrays Hume as a foundationalist who puts sense data or perceptual experience first in a way that is not firmly guided by science and departs from common sense in embracing external world skepticism. Accordingly, Hume is not an ancestor of the Second Philosopher. Reid is guided by science and common sense in his investigation of perception, hence he does qualify as an ancestor of the Second Philosopher, even given that he was a mind–body dualist. Maddy rightly doesn’t buy into a common picture in which the ancestors of later science were exclusively materialistic reductionists (19–20). The subsequent paper (II.4) examines Moore’s famous argument that two hands exist. It interprets him as making the “deliverances of science” (146) relevant to the question of the existence of an external world, allying him with “ordinary evidence” and the naturalism of Second Philosophy (147). The third paper (II.5) examines Wittgenstein’s early fascination with the position that “the sense of a representation must be independent of any contingent facts about the world” (149), a position rejected in the Philosophical Investigations, leading Wittgenstein to acknowledge, in On Certainty, part 1, the soundness of Moore’s approach to existence (170).

III. Logic and Language: this section starts with “truth” and “reference” (III.6). It eschews producing a theory about referring and being true, instead deflationarily suggesting that what should be studied is how language in fact yields successful communication, without expecting a single, unified answer. It then turns to Second Philosophy of logic (III.7–8), notably finding that logic may be true for the macroscopic world but that it runs into trouble in the micro-, quantum world. The Second Philosopher thus endorses a limited form of Realism: logic sometimes describes how the world is. In the course of discussion, III.7 runs through and rejects attempts to frame a general philosophy of logic bearing similarity to standard positions in philosophy of mathematics: Logicism (and offshoots), Intuitionism, and Formalism, as well as Platonic Realism as opposed to logical Conventionalism. A non-Platonic Realism remains: “logical laws are true in any situation with the right physical structuring; their truth is contingent on the presence of that structuring” (214).

IV. Mathematics: this section starts with an examination of “Psychology and the a priori Sciences” (IV.9), in which logic and arithmetic are viewed in relation to developmental psychology, neurophysiology, and vision science, yielding the position that common-sensical conceptions of objects and properties hold when the relevant structures are present (see III.7–8), and that our basic cognition of these properties, as studied in developmental psychology, largely explains what is called the “a priori” basis of these conceptions. Further, “simple” arithmetic is true but “mathematical arithmetic” (think infinite sequences) is based on an intuitive picture that our innate recursive linguistic faculty leads us to, and which does not enjoy certainty or sustain strong claims to truth (250–51). This finding about arithmetic is elaborated by responding to the question “Do Numbers Exist?” (IV.10). The final paper, “Enhanced If-thenism” (IV.11), wonders “what are we doing when we engage in mathematical thinking?” (262). It accepts the picture that, prior to the twentieth century, mathematics was about finding structures that describe the physical world. But in the twentieth century (partly as the result of nineteenth-century developments), mathematics came to be about abstracta. Two answers to the question of what we are doing arose: Platonism about abstracta, and “if-thenism,” which says that pure mathematics is about consequences, “what conclusions follow from which assumptions” (263). Maddy seeks to shore up if-thenism by carefully responding to various objections, leading her to an Enhanced If-thenism, which acknowledges that work must go into deciding the mathematical interest of the proposed “ifs” from which consequences are sought. Her position “supports the use of classical logic in most cases and preserves the unconditional truth of elementary arithmetic” (292), while avoiding “anything goes” conventionalism beyond these bounds.

The various papers disclose characteristics of the Second Philosopher. She holds that Hume’s naturalism and Secondism are called into question by his making the Science of Man the foundation for the other sciences (18, n. 30). The Second Philosopher is no friend of foundationalism. She notes that Hume begins the Treatise of Human Nature (I.1.1–2) by invoking sense data or the “theory of ideas”; unfortunately, because he made the Science of Man fundamental and hence prior to physics, optics, and physiology (96–98), Hume can’t use the full range of science in scientifically assessing the operation of the senses, as would the Second Philosopher (and Reid). We also find that the Second Philosopher is opposed to Kantian transcendentalism, because it puts philosophy before science (7, 28). Further, the Second Philosopher is skeptical about philosophical theories that range across many positions, doubting, for example, that van Fraassen’s Empiricism actually confronts an extant philosophy-first Scientific Realism that describes science in general (5, 89–90). Stanford’s Instrumentalism denies that there is a general normative standard for Realism in science (agreeing with Maddy). But his Realist opponents apparently do not include the Second Philosopher, who keeps the discussion completely local, going case by case and asking, for instance, whether the work on Brownian motion is good enough to show that atoms exist, a question that Stanford apparently doesn’t answer (ibid.).

Other characteristics are revealed. The Second Philosopher periodically assesses her own methods and beliefs. She “circles back” to validate her methods and check her current beliefs as she moves forward with her projects and interests. She is concerned with the topic “the world and our place in it” and investigates it using ordinary perceptual beliefs, common sense, observation, experiment, and theorizing. A priori methods are suspect. Transcendentalism finds no purchase.

These points raise questions. We might ask: are these attitudes about what is acceptable and unacceptable already the result of doing a bit of Second Philosophy, which starts with ordinary perception, but then tests various methods moving forward (including an examination of when perception is reliable)? In 2007, Maddy used Descartes’ a priori methods to set up a contrast between philosophy-first apriorism and the Second Philosopher. In the present collection, she adopts another stance: the Second Philosopher tests a priori methods before rejecting them (53). Indeed, Maddy confesses (28, n. 56) that in 2007 she was wrong to make Descartes the prototypical First Philosopher. Kant now has that honor. Descartes belongs among the Second Philosophers because he philosophizes in order to “change physics.” In addition, the Second Philosopher considers and evaluates transcendentalism, and she “sees no reason to sign on to the transcendentalist project” (56). Transcendentalism isn’t ruled out ahead of time; rather, upon consideration, it fails to gain her confidence.

The Second Philosopher can have various starting points and show various paths of development. To the charge that the Second Philosopher is “too individualistic” because scientific theories manifest themselves in scientific communities, Maddy replies that she’s happy to consider the Second Philosopher as “recapitulating the history of science” (e.g., as regards the application of mathematics to nature) and indeed to think of her “as an embodiment of the scientific community” (2). The latter offer strikes me as problematic, since the scientific community is not homogeneous, there being disagreements within it. Perhaps it’s OK if the Second Philosopher is of two minds on various topics or proposals, as long as her choices in the end are responsive to accepted methods of rendering evidence and assessing theories. I find attractive another way of envisioning the intellectual development of the Second Philosopher. Maddy offers a “top-down characterization” of the Second Philosopher: “instead of starting with perceptual beliefs and working upward, imagine her starting with the full variety of common sense, natural science, mathematics, and more, and gradually whittling away the parts that aren’t well supported” (2–3, n. 6). She thinks that this starting point ultimately would yield the same outcome. I would elaborate: let’s follow the Second Philosopher as an undergraduate major in history and philosophy of science who also studies plenty of science and then goes on to graduate school, studying integrated history and philosophy of science, which brings history of science and philosophy together and pays attention to scientific practice. This leads her to become sensitive to the historical conditioning of her own common sense and to realize how current theory reflects past conceptions of the available theoretical options. She now investigates the historical development of what is fundamental in modern physics (corpuscular mechanism, vector forces, field theories, old and new quantum), while admitting that the implications of especially the new quantum remain unresolved. She studies the development of theories of vision, with an appreciation that some philosophical questions, such as the attempt to find a single metaphysical answer to “what is color?” may be misguided, so that philosophers would be better off understanding the ways in which color perception is conditioned by illumination and by physiological features of perceivers, while also considering the particular philosophical motivations at play when engaging color science. She would consider the history of scientific realism, rejecting an encompassing Realism for much of science and turning instead to a case-by-case investigation of science-based existence claims.

There are other instances of development in the volume. In the paper on Hume and Reid (first published in 2011), Maddy declines to examine one of Hume’s arguments for perceptual relativity because it turns on “irrelevant” issues, such as “the thorny matter of what counts as ‘resemblance’” (103, n. 18). But in her analysis of the historical debate about primary and secondary qualities in the recently minted lead paper (I.1), she uses perceptual resemblance as an important element of analysis (35–36).

As it happens, I have a bone to pick about the treatment of Hume (II.3). Maddy carefully examines the authority Hume gives to the Science of Man in his Treatise. She notes that we need not consider him to have begged the question when he begins the investigation with impressions, ideas, and (I would add) associative laws (96–98). He could be circling back from his discussions in Treatise, I.4. But she does wonder how he could defend his view that, as an empirical project, the Science of Man is to be given epistemic authority over the other sciences (99–101). These are intricate matters, but my suggestion would be to see Hume as circling back from his examination of force and causation (Treatise, I.3.14; elaborated in Enquiry, VII). By Maddy’s own account, a central tenet of eighteenth-century mechanism was “that physical phenomena should be explained in terms of forces acting on a line between two bodies, depending only on the distance between them” (Second Philosophy, 15; present volume, passim). But Hume found that investigations into cognition within the Science of Man reveal that we have no conception of force in bodies; the notion of force in nature draws its content from association-induced expectations in the experiencing subject. This changes our attitude toward what is truly revealed by the Natural Sciences—empirical regularities but not ultimate conceptions of reality—while also allowing us to be guided by said regularities. Here, the Science of Man offers insights into and limitations on the fundamental findings of Natural Science. In a sense, the associative laws underlie a kind of Natural Science of the mind, which also serves the moral and political side of the Science of Man. This interpretation makes Hume an ally of the Second Philosopher. But here I can only recommend further consideration of this proposal, without providing a detailed argument on its behalf.

I would also qualify Maddy’s claim, in “A Plea for Natural Philosophy,” that philosophy and science were seamlessly joined during the early modern period (18–19). Descartes and Leibniz, for instance, distinguished between metaphysics and natural philosophy within their own writings. And even if reform in natural philosophy was part of what they hoped to gain from metaphysics, that branch of philosophy included topics not always found in the natural philosophy of the day, such as the abstract metaphysics of an infinite non-material substance (God). In addition, while Berkeley’s New Theory of Vision can properly be viewed as a natural philosophy of vision (20, 44), some have argued that it was in the service of the metaphysical position of immaterialism, putting metaphysics first (perhaps surreptitiously). But Maddy’s point stands that work in natural philosophy was regularly carried out by individuals who are now classified as philosophers and that this was not considered to be unusual or improper.

The present volume is a welcome addition to Maddy’s project of articulating Second Philosophy. The breadth and depth of her investigations, including forays into the history and philosophy of early modern science and philosophy, questions about the proper direction and methods of philosophy of science, the relation between ordinary language philosophy and the sciences, and extensive interpretation and analysis of questions in philosophy of logic and philosophy of mathematics, inspire awe. Maddy has the curiosity and philosophical acumen that are so fully on display in the Second Philosopher. She embodies an integrated history and philosophy of science that is informed by actual science and extracts its philosophical frameworks from the investigation of real cases. I commend the volume to a broad audience, whose members find themselves curious about the various topics as described.


Berkeley, George. An Essay towards a New Theory of Vision. Dublin: Rhames and Papyat, 1709.

Hume, David. An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, ed. Peter Millican. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.

Hume, David. A Treatise of Human Nature, eds. David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.

Maddy, Penelope. Second Philosophy: A Naturalistic Method. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.

Wittgenstein, Ludwig. On Certainty, ed. G. E. M. Anscombe and G. H. von Wright. Oxford: Blackwell, 1969.

Wittgenstein, Ludwig. Philosophical Investigations, fourth edition, trans. G. E. M. Anscombe, P. M. S. Hacker, and Joachim Shulte. Oxford: Blackwell, 2009.