A Political Theory for the Jewish People

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Chaim Gans, A Political Theory for the Jewish People, Oxford University Press, 2016, 305pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190237547.

Reviewed by Benjamin Pollock, Hebrew University of Jerusalem


Chaim Gans' The Limits of Nationalism (2003) argued on liberal grounds for the enduring importance of cultural nationalism, and his A Just Zionism (2008) introduced an interpretation of Zionism according to which this particular case of cultural nationalism may be viewed as justifiable. In his most recent work, Gans clarifies the uniqueness of his own "egalitarian" interpretation of Zionism by situating it among a wide range of interpretations of Zionism as political idea and reality. He surveys the principal positions in the current debate over Zionism; analyzes and evaluates the arguments advanced by each of these positions and explores the moral ontologies they presuppose and the historiographies of Judaism they imply; and draws out the implications of these positions both for the relations between Jews and Arabs in Israel/Palestine, and for the relations between Jews inside and outside the state of Israel.

Gans' egalitarian Zionist position emerges out of his critique of an array of Zionist and post-Zionist positions in a manner reminiscent of the way Kant's critical account of metaphysics emerged out of his engagement with dogmatism and skepticism. Playing the role of the dogmatists here are mainstream Zionists, while post-Zionists fill the part of the skeptics. According to Gans, mainstream Zionism, especially in its "proprietary" form, overstates the case for Jewish national existence in Israel/Palestine, basing its position on a claim of collective Jewish ownership of the land since ancient times, and then insisting that Jews, after being exiled from this land following the destruction of the ancient Judean state, have never ceased in their attempts to return to it. Gans suggests such historically dubious claims are the product of a worry over the justifiability of the Zionist project, given the uniqueness of the Jewish people as a collective that doesn't fit neatly into the traditional category of nationhood. Post-Zionists, on the other hand, sense the problematic character of mainstream Zionist claims. But in response, Gans explains, they are driven to the other extreme, rejecting Zionism as a nationalist project in its entirety. Many support their rejection with the claim that Zionists "invented" Jewish nationhood or, indeed, that Jews have rarely even considered themselves a single collective.

Taking seriously some of the critical aspects of the post-Zionist position, Gans provides a broad critique of the exaggerated claims of mainstream Zionism. But doing so does not lead him to reject Zionism tout court. Rather, he shows the dubious claims of mainstream Zionism are unnecessary to justify Jewish national existence in Israel/Palestine. In their stead, Gans introduces a series of modest moral and historical claims which together argue for the justifiability of Zionism: claims regarding the rights of ethno-cultural groups to national self-determination; regarding the justifications Jews had in the 19th century to realize their national identity irrespective of whether they had been a full-fledged nation since antiquity; regarding the centrality of the Land of Israel within Jewish collective memory; and regarding the existential threat Jews faced in Europe culminating in the Holocaust. According to Gans, these factors support an interpretation of Zionism as a just national project, despite the fact that the history of Zionism includes numerous injustices.

It should be clear that Gans' argument for the justice of the Zionist project is in no way a wholesale justification of historical Zionism. He advocates the justifiability of only a particular -- egalitarian -- version of Zionism, one that is at odds with the proprietary version of Zionism governing in Israel today. Only egalitarian Zionism, in Gans' view, survives critique; it alone, we might suggest, presents a "Zionism within the limits of justice alone." Thus, his justification of Zionism is at once a call on Israel to abandon that proprietary interpretation of Zionism that has regularly led to and continues to implicate the state in institutional injustice, and instead to actualize a just Zionism. And Gans argues that his egalitarian version of Zionism offers the best chance of providing a stable basis for future agreements between Jews and Palestinians.

Before exploring Gans' account of egalitarian Zionism, let me review his analysis and critique of mainstream Zionism and post-Zionism. As I've noted, he suggests that early Zionists found themselves in need of a justification for Jewish national existence in Palestine/Israel when it was not clear that the Jewish people could be defined as a nation, given the accepted notion of nationhood as a collective that has possessed, across generations, a single common language, a shared common territory, and a unified set of cultural conventions. The proprietary version of Zionism, which found support in the official Zionist historiography of the first decades of the state of Israel, offered a justification for Jewish national existence in Palestine/Israel through a narrative about the Jewish collective's ownership and loss of possession of its ancient territory. According to this narrative, the Jewish collective came into being in the Land of Israel in ancient times, was forcibly expelled, but never ceased its attempt to return to it. Trading on the legal proprietary distinction between physical possession of a property and the right of ownership over it, such a narrative allowed mainstream Zionists to argue that while the Jewish collective had lost possession of its property, it maintained its right to ownership over it, persistently identifying itself as rightful owner by striving to return to its property. This narrative not only offered justification for conceiving of the Zionist movement as exercising the right the Jewish people retained to repossess its historic homeland. It also justified withholding collective rights from the majority Arab population living in the land at the turn of the 20th century. For according to the terms of the narrative, the Arab collective was merely the latest in a series of squatters illegally occupying property stolen from the Jewish collective.

Gans makes a number of salient points in analyzing the proprietary Zionist narrative. He highlights the collectivist moral ontology which the narrative presupposes: it only makes sense to speak of a Jewish right to ownership and repossession of territory over a span of two thousand years on the assumption that collectives, and not individuals, are the fundamental subjects of political morality. Gans argues convincingly that it is the combination of this collectivist ontology and the proprietary framing of the Zionist narrative in terms of ownership, robbery, and repossession that provides a worldview for mainstream Zionists that excuses injustices which Jews have carried out in the name of actualizing their national identity. Thus, according to Gans, not only the withholding of collective rights to Arabs, but also the constant acquiescence to the settler movement and its taking of land owned by individual Palestinians rests on the proprietary assumptions of the mainstream Zionist narrative. Moreover, it is in the collective ontology of mainstream Zionism, and not merely in the messianic vision of extremists, that Gans locates a foremost threat to Israeli democracy. For democracy presupposes an individualist ontology, viewing human individuals and not collectives as the basic units of political morality. The long-standing commitment to the proprietary narrative and its collectivist underpinning, among Zionist leaders from the pre-state period through the mainstream Israeli political landscape today, gives the impression -- an impression which post-Zionists make explicit but which Gans himself rejects -- that Zionism is essentially and inexorably unjust and anti-democratic. Gans indeed agrees that "Israel is doomed to continue to act in all these ways as long as its policy is inspired and shaped by the proprietary interpretation of the Zionist narrative. The logic of this interpretation endorses these modes of behavior" (69).

According to Gans, the very claims about the Jewish collective and its historical relationship to Israel/Palestine which support the proprietary interpretation of Zionism are deeply problematic. For instance, claims that Jews have always viewed themselves as a nation (and not, say, as a religious community); that in prayers for the return to Zion Jews have expressed, in every generation, their intention to resume national existence in their ancient homeland (rather than their messianic wish for redemption); and even that the exile of Jews from the Land of Israel in the first centuries CE was entirely forced upon them from without. These claims do not hold up to historical scrutiny. In "avoiding telling the whole truth" (50) about such matters, Gans suggests, those committed to the proprietary narrative undermine the case for Zionism as a whole. For they too leave the impression -- an impression post-Zionists articulate but which Gans himself again rejects -- that Zionism cannot be honestly or truthfully justified. Gans will want to assert, I've noted, that the dubious claims upon which the proprietary narrative of Zionism rests are not simply false, but unnecessary: the justifiability of Zionism can be argued for without overstating claims for a national essence of Judaism and for the persistent attempt on the part of Jews to resume national-political life in Israel/Palestine, and without formulating the relationship of Jews to that territory in terms of ownership.

Post-Zionists reject Zionism largely because they question the possibility of the kind of liberal interpretation of ethno-cultural nationalism for which Gans argues. Opposing the perpetuation of the Jewish ethno-cultural nation, they advocate either the realization of a civic nation in Israel/Palestine in which factors of religious, ethnic, and cultural identity are divorced from political institutions ("civic post-Zionism"); the realization of a multi-cultural nation in Israel/Palestine in which formerly oppressed groups are granted compensatory rights ("postcolonial post-Zionism"); or the return to a diasporic Jewish identity ("neo-diasporic post-Zionism"). The post-Zionist critique of Zionism exposes the injustices carried out by Jews against Arabs (as well as those carried out by European Jews against non-European Jews) in the course of the state's establishment, and the pattern of injustice in which the state remains embroiled today. It likewise exposes the dubious claims about the persistence of national Jewish identity and the commitment to its re-establishment over history, upon which the proprietary narrative depends. So far, so good, says Gans. But just as the proprietary Zionist narrative overstates the case for Jewish national identity over its history, so post-Zionism overstates its justification for the rejection of Jewish nationhood. In response to the official Zionist historiography's claim that the Jewish people has always self-identified as a nation, many post-Zionists claim that early Zionists "invented" the very notion of Jewish nationhood itself -- as Gans notes, Shlomo Sand even claims the Jewish people were never a nation -- and that they then proceeded to mislead Jews into conceiving of themselves as members of a nation. Such claims to a Zionist invention of Jewish nationhood are supposed to be uniquely damning to the Zionist project. Moreover, according to Gans, post-Zionists like Judith Butler leap from actual wrongs carried out by Zionists over the history of Zionism to the claim that Zionism is essentially unjust, and they thereby identify the whole of Zionism with its proprietary interpretation.

Gans' egalitarian interpretation of Zionism aims to articulate a Zionism that can be justified, that does not suffer from the excesses of proprietary Zionism and thus does not fall prey to what Gans sees as the valid aspects of the post-Zionist critique. Recall that according to Gans, the proprietary Zionist claim that Jews have always been a nation seeking to repossess its land was unnecessary for the task for which it was procured. In order to justify aspiring to national self-determination, Gans argues, Jews did not need to have been a nation at every moment of their history; they didn't even need to be a full-fledged nation at the time of the rise of the Zionist movement. Rather, Gans claims, given the universal right ethno-cultural groups have to national self-determination; given that in the collective memory of Jews and of significant parts of humanity Jews once were a nation -- living in a common territory, speaking a single language, and sharing common cultural conventions; and given that such national self-determination could legitimately be viewed as the only viable escape from the existential threat Jews faced in the late 19th and early 20th century, Zionist leaders could argue that it was both conceptually feasible and morally justified for Jews to realize their collective self-determination in the form of a full-fledged nation. "Zionists could have . . . claimed," Gans writes, "and still can at present claim, that it was desirable and justified, and that it is still desirable and justified, for the Jewish collective to view itself, or to interpret itself as a nation, even if it was not and is not a nation in the full sense of the word" (28).

As part of his account of the right Jews had and have to realize themselves collectively in national form, Gans offers a rich explanation of the importance for individuals of membership in ethno-cultural collectives and of the preservation of such collectives. Elaborating on ideas he formulated in The Limits of Nationalism, Gans suggests that many people wish to live within the framework of their formative or ancestral culture and that they experience their free decisions and pursuits as meaningful primarily within their cultural contexts. People are invested in preserving their culture over generations, because the meaningfulness of their endeavors is wrapped up in their belief in their culture's continued existence. National self-determination can be understood as a means for individual members of ethno-cultural collectives to preserve those collectives and thereby to promote their own well-being. Gans suggests ethno-cultural groups, Jews included, have a universal right to such self-determination. Notice that Gans' account rests on an individualist, and not collectivist, moral ontology.

Gans' account of the rights of ethno-cultural collectives to national self-determination lays the ground for his discussion of Israel/Palestine as the Jewish homeland. He claims that the desire to realize one's well-being within an ethno-cultural collective is often tied up with one's identification with a historical homeland; thus, committed members of a collective often retain sentimental ties to their historically formative territories even if they have ceased to occupy them. Gans suggests that the primacy of a territory within the collective memory and identity of an ethno-cultural group can serve as basis for establishing the location in which an ethno-cultural group's right to national self-determination is to be realized. Such reflections lead Gans to justify Jewish national self-determination in Israel/Palestine not based on claims to Jewish ownership of this territory, but rather based on the centrality of that territory within Jewish collective memory and the identification of the Jews with the Land of Israel both among Jews themselves and in large parts of humanity.

The last element of Gans' justification of Zionism is historical. He claims that the period in which Zionism arose was a period in which Jews faced existential threat; the persecutions of Jews around the world, and in Europe in particular, left Jews with very few options for the kind of secure existence and self-determination that would ensure the survival of their culture. National self-determination in Palestine/Israel could therefore be understood as further justified due to the need Jews had at that historical moment to rescue their persons and to safeguard their culture for future generations.

Gans' justification of the Zionist project thus draws on universal rights ethno-cultural groups have for national self-determination, in territories with which they have identity ties, together with a historical argument about the urgent need Jews had for such national self-determination at a particular moment. According to Gans, these factors not only justify the Zionist project; they also set limits to the political, moral, and territorial shape and direction of Zionism. Zionism must recognize that the historical homeland in which it actualizes its right to national self-determination is a territory that was already inhabited by another ethno-cultural group with its own justification to aspire to national self-determination there. The Jewish right to self-determination in Israel/Palestine did not and does not include the right to oppress or expel its Arab inhabitants. According to Gans, egalitarian Zionism thus calls for reparations for Palestinians in compensation for the injustice they suffered as part of the Jewish establishment of its national existence in the state of Israel. Although Gans has argued elsewhere for the preferability of a sub-statist realization of national self-determination, and hence of multi-national states, largely practical concerns lead him to advocate the two-state solution to the ongoing Israeli-Palestinian conflict.

Gans argues that the grounds for justification he offers for Zionism also place limits on territorial expansion in Israel. The borders of the state should be limited, according to him, to those borders that were set when the urgent need for self-preservation in the face of persecution was at its height, i.e., in the 1940s. A Jewish state with these borders is justifiable. The expansion of Israel through West Bank settlements in the wake of the Six-Day War in 1967, according to Gans, can only be explained as an expression of the proprietary interpretation of Zionism.

Gans' book announces itself as a political theory for the Jewish people. Although the book focuses on Jewish national identity, the interpretation of Zionism presented in it has important consequences for the Jewish diaspora. For years, mainstream Zionism addressed itself to diaspora Jews according to the principle of "the negation of exile," suggesting the only viable option for Jewish existence is to be found in national self-determination. Gans helpfully shows how the standard attitude of condescension on the part of Zionist leaders towards diaspora Jews follows directly from the collectivist ontology of the proprietary narrative. For if proprietary Zionists believe that, in order to justify national existence in Israel, they must claim Jews have always and at every moment been the collective national subject which owns and seeks to repossess its territory, then Jews who do not join in the act of repossession undermine that justification, denying with their feet that Jews are essentially a collective national subject. Post-Zionism's call to dissolve Jewish national identity entirely is problematic, on the other hand, because it ignores the very aspects of non-national life that have made diasporic Jewish existence so tenuous over the generations and which inspired the Zionist project in the first place -- homelessness, subjection to persecution, dependence on the compassion of others. According to Gans' egalitarian account, Zionism gives individual Jews around the world the option (but not the duty!) to view themselves as members of a nation and to realize their ethno-cultural identities in national form. Gans suggests, moreover, that national Jewish existence in Israel gives Jews around the world greater freedom to mix and match ethnic, religious, and civic elements in the formation of their individual identities, ultimately increasing the range of choices available for individual self-actualization around the globe, as well as the authenticity of choices individuals make. But rather than give the state of Israel warrant for condescension towards diaspora Jews, he suggests the centrality of Jewish existence in Israel places responsibility on the state for the legacy of Judaism.

Gans' book is truly noteworthy for the clarity with which it presents the arguments and presuppositions of the parties to a messy, emotionally-charged and often rhetorically-irresponsible debate over Zionism; and for the transparency with which it presents the arguments and presuppositions of Gans' own egalitarian position. There are stronger and weaker elements of the particular justification he gives for Zionism. In the book's afterword, Gans himself wonders whether his own prejudice in favor of Zionism has allowed him to grant more credence to the historical argument from need than is warranted. Moreover, while I find compelling his claim that egalitarian Zionism offers an interpretation of Jewish national existence which not only opens up a vista for a just Zionism into the future, but which early Zionists also could have adopted themselves, I am less convinced by Gans' attempt to present his egalitarian Zionism as a legitimate interpretation of the actual Zionist movement (146-47). Gans doesn't appear to need to make this latter claim. That the egalitarian view was available to early Zionists and that it is available to us seems sufficient to argue for its viability; and the further claim clouds his otherwise clear distinction between the political theory of Zionism, on the one hand, and the historical manifestations of Zionism, on the other. Ultimately, he submits that "even if this book's version of Zionism's past morality is not entirely accurate, . . . it is morally imperative to adopt it" (228), because it is both more accurate and convincing than the alternatives, and because it offers the greatest promise for stability and coexistence between Jews and Arabs in Palestine/Israel. Although he doesn't say as much, I take Gans to understand the relationship in which the Jewish collective stands today to egalitarian Zionism in much the way he has described the relationship in which 19th-century Jews stood to national self-determination. Egalitarian Zionism presents one of the possibilities open today to be realized by the Jewish people. If Gans is right, it is the sole possibility of continued Jewish national self-determination in the state of Israel that is both desirable and justifiable.


Thanks to Chaim Gans, Assaf Sharon, and Scott Ury for helpful comments.