A Priori Justification

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Casullo, Albert, A Priori Justification, Oxford University Press, 2003, 272pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195115058.

Reviewed by Panayot Butchvarov, University of Iowa


Professor Casullo’s goal in this noteworthy book is to provide “a systematic treatment of the primary epistemological issues associated with the a priori that is sensitive to recent developments in the field of epistemology.” This he does admirably. The recent developments to which he thinks sensitivity is needed are the ascendancy of naturalism, both philosophical and scientific, and the decline of Cartesianism and foundationalism. His treatment is not only systematic but almost exhaustive. Virtually every option is discussed patiently and dispassionately, with detailed attention to the existing literature, from Plato and Kant to Quine and BonJour. His accounts of the major issues regarding the nature, existence, and sources of a priori knowledge and justification are detailed, judicious, and penetrating. Casullo argues that to resolve them we must appeal to empirical evidence.

Analytic epistemology has focused on a posteriori, empirical knowledge, perhaps because of its early ties to British empiricism, and even its general accounts of knowledge seek conformity mainly with alleged examples of empirical knowledge, e.g., what make of car someone owns or whether what one sees is a barn. It has tended to ignore priori knowledge, BonJour’s In Defense of Pure Reason being an important exception. Yet traditional epistemology considered a priori knowledge, especially mathematics, to be the paradigm. It is much less vulnerable to the skeptical attacks that were the raison d’être of epistemology. Descartes’ fear of Divine deception about 2+3=5 was regarded, even by him, as extravagant, and the core of Hume’s “skepticism with regard to reason” was an unexceptionable argument for the dependence of reasoning on memory.

The arrival of Casullo’s book is thus a welcome addition to the contemporary literature. I expect it to be the central work in the epistemology of the a priori for years to come. Its title is “a priori justification,” not “a priori knowledge,” for the good reason that there may be false beliefs that are justified a priori (mathematics is rife with examples). Casullo’s use of the deontic term “justified” can be questioned as inapplicable to beliefs, since actions are justified or unjustified and beliefs are not actions, but this does not affect the substance of what he says. He just as easily could have spoken of “reasons” or, better, “evidence” for a belief, rather than of its “justification.” And the application of what he says to a priori knowledge, the concern of traditional epistemology, which made a sharp distinction between knowledge and opinion, is seamless, since Casullo takes for granted that knowledge is some sort of justified true belief.

One of the many virtues of the book is the extraordinary wealth of distinctions made in it. I cannot do justice to them in a review, but here is an outline of those that are pivotal. On the most general level, we must distinguish the questions (1) what is priori justification, (2) is there a priori justification, (3) if there is, what are its sources, and (4) how do we establish that something is such a source, that there are such sources. Both traditional and contemporary epistemologists often try to answer one of these questions by answering another.

Casullo’s answer to the first is that a priori justification is just nonexperiential justification. This fits what “a priori knowledge” has usually meant and how the phrase is commonly explained to novices. When we say that logic and mathematics are apriori, we are likely to be answering the second question, unless our concern is solely with the philosophy of logic or of mathematics. When we say that a priori knowledge is knowledge grounded in reason (“truths of reason”), we are offering an answer, however vague, to the third question. And if we defend this answer by appealing to the alleged necessity, analyticity, or certainty of a priori beliefs, we may think we are answering the fourth but probably attempting to answer all four questions. We also are indulging in numerous assumptions, each of which requires separate and detailed defense: that no a posteriori beliefs are necessary, that no a priori beliefs are contingent, that only analytic beliefs are necessary, that only a priori beliefs are certain, and so on. Much of the book consists in detailed discussions of such assumptions, traced with erudition and good judgment to their sources, traditional or contemporary.

Although Casullo says that a priori justification is just nonexperiential justification, he proceeds immediately to ask, as one must but few do, What is meant by the term “experience”? Not even radical empiricists offer a useful answer, though they are committed to the thesis that all knowledge is experiential, i.e., that there is no a priori knowledge. Intuition of the Platonic Forms can also count as experience in the broad sense of the term. How narrowly should it be understood then to be useful? Casullo plausibly suggests that it is “a putative natural kind term whose reference is fixed by local paradigms,” namely, “the cognitive processes associated with the five senses” (p. 158). But he also argues that whether these paradigms have significant underlying properties that are shared with unquestionably experiential but nonsensory sources of knowledge such as memory and introspection must be left to empirical investigation to discover, not to philosophers’ intuitions or conceptual analysis. He draws an analogy in this respect with the much discussed case of the term “water,” the reference of which is hardly to be decided by appealing to “what we mean.”

It follows that the philosophically crucial question whether there is nonexperiential, i.e., a priori, justification or knowledge is also to be left to empirical investigation. Such investigation might focus, for example, on the actual practices in allegedly a priori disciplines such as mathematics. It would take seriously the history of mathematics and the psychology of mathematicians in order to determine what they take to be their sources of justification and to what extent there is variation among them in this respect. Such investigations are manageable and to some extent have already been attempted. One could reasonably expect help also from neuroscience, I might add, but this remains a hope about the future.

Casullo argues persuasively that Kant’s views about the relationships between the a priori and the necessary, and between the a priori and the analytic, which set the guiding themes in the epistemology of the a priori for more than two centuries, cast little light on the prior and more fundamental questions “What is a priori knowledge?” and “Is there a priori knowledge?” It follows that not much light on them is also cast by Kripke’s examples purporting to show that there is a priori knowledge of contingent propositions as well as a posteriori knowledge of necessary propositions. The same is true of Frege’s claim that all arithmetic truths are derivable from logical laws and definitions. It leaves us with the question about the nature of our knowledge of logic. The positivist view that all priori truths are analytic also leaves us in the dark, for the same reason, if what is meant is that they are reducible to truths of logic; if something else is meant, it remains notoriously unclear. Nor does Quine’s celebrated argument against the analytic-synthetic distinction address, by itself, the two fundamental questions about the a priori, though Quine does so in other ways. Of course, Casullo does not question the independent importance of Kant’s, Frege’s, Kripke’s, the positivists’, or Quine’s contributions. His aim is to set order in the medley of issues that have preoccupied epistemologists of the a priori. He accomplishes this with clarity and thoroughness.

Casullo’s denial that questions about the a priori can be resolved by relying on introspection or conceptual analysis, i.e., by what less charitably might be called arm-chair philosophy, sets him apart from most traditional and contemporary epistemologists, both those (“the apriorists”) who say that there is and those (“the radical empiricists”) who say that there is not a priori justification. As I noted earlier, this is so in respect to the seemingly conceptual question “What is a priori justification?” If experience is a natural kind, its scope and nature require the sort of investigation that is standard in the investigation of other natural kinds. Only empirical evidence, not introspective opinion or conceptual analysis, can establish whether there is a legitimate experiential/nonexperiential distinction. And then we would need empirical evidence to tell us whether there are nonexperiential sources of justification. Therefore, if beliefs count as justified in virtue of the processes leading to them, then whether some beliefs issue from reliable processes that do not involve experience, and what exactly is the nature of those processes, also could be decided only on the basis of empirical evidence, not speculation.

Thus Casullo’s approach is not merely that of naturalism. He insists that we must actually rely on empirical findings, whether of biology, psychology, or the history of mathematics, for answers to the philosophical questions he raises. Surely, he is right. Epistemology is about human, not angelic or divine, knowledge and belief. The idea that philosophers may seek special, philosophical knowledge of facts about them would be like the idea that they may seek special, philosophical knowledge of cardiovascular or urogenital facts about humans. Even if we had no doubts about introspection, would it allow me to suppose that what I find to be true of my cognitive states is also true of the states of others? And if I did not suppose that it is, what contribution would I be making to philosophy, which surely aims at being more than a private diary? The usual way out, of course, is to say that philosophers investigate only the concepts of cognitive states, not the facts about them, that they are engaged in “conceptual,” not “factual” inquiry, not even an introspective one.

Despite his insistence on empirical investigation, Casullo himself seems to adopt this way out, at least in style and terminology. He usefully distinguishes between scientific naturalism, Quine’s view that epistemology be replaced by scientific inquiries, and philosophical naturalism, which “requires that the analysans of a concept include only naturalistically respectable concepts” (p. 126). By insisting on empirical evidence he seems closer to scientific naturalism. But by describing himself as “analyzing the concept of a priori justification,” often relying on thought-experiments and “intuitions” of whether “we would say” that a certain belief is justified in a certain imaginary situation, he would seem to be at most a philosophical naturalist. Chemistry was concerned with water itself, its molecular composition, not with the concept of water or what we would or would not say in various imaginary situations. The same is true of the other disciplines engaged in empirical investigation. But what may be more important is that if concepts are, or at least are tied to, uses of words – Casullo is not likely to say they are private inhabitants of consciousness – then it is doubtful that there is special, philosophical knowledge even of concepts. There is linguistics, as well as serious, scholarly lexicography. And if concepts are structures, states, or functions of the brain, there is neurology.

I mentioned earlier that Casullo’s demand for empirical evidence is amply justified by the fact that the cognitive states epistemology investigates are human, states of a certain kind of animals. He is well aware, however, that much of epistemology intentionally ignores this fact. He brands it as Cartesian and foundationalist. I have agreed that attempting, as Cartesian philosophers do, to answer the questions he raises by introspection is misguided. But there are questions, properly describable as Cartesian and foundationalist, to which empirical evidence is irrelevant (unless we mean the data of introspection). Descartes began his meditations by questioning the sources of all evidence, empirical and nonempirical. Kant could not have appealed to neurological evidence about the innate structure of the brain, much as he would have been interested in it, because he was concerned with the conditions of the possibility of all knowledge, including that sought by neurology. It would be jejune to think of Descartes and Kant as misguided. But also it would be a mistake to think of their approach as competing with Casullo’s. The questions they asked may seem the same, but in fact are dramatically different. They can be asked only from the first-person perspective.

For example, Casullo expresses legitimate doubts about establishing a priori truth through traditional appeals to unthinkability or inconceivability. But if faced with a disastrous result when balancing my checkbook, I would not even consider that 3+2 might equal 10, rather than a measly 5, though I would benefit greatly if it did. For I would be immediately faced with the utter unthinkability of this being so, e.g., of three fingers of my left hand together with two fingers of my right hand being equal in number to all the fingers of my two normal hands. If a mathematician told me otherwise, I would not timidly acquiesce, as I might on other matters, I would assume I misunderstood what I heard. A similar point applies to a posteriori knowledge. If I complain that I am in pain but my doctor assures me there is “nothing wrong” with me, I would not cease to believe I am in pain, even if I do not question the doctor’s findings. These are examples of what is right in Cartesian foundationalism.

What is wrong in it, but perhaps insufficiently appreciated by Casullo, is twofold. First, to be of use in a cognitive discipline, rather than just a private diary, such allegedly foundational knowledge must receive expression in judgments that employ concepts in accord with their established use and thus are subject to appraisal overstepping the bounds of any foundational knowledge. Second, no genuine cognitive disciplines can develop on the basis of the alleged foundations by means of inferences that pass the test of unthinkabilty of falsity (as in the mathematical example above) or just of mistake (as in the example of pain). That this is so is made evident by the skeptic, who usually allows for the foundational knowledge but denies that it entails the rest of what we claim to know. As Hume pointed out, even in mathematical reasoning we must rely on memory. Moreover, both mathematics and all empirical disciplines are social institutions or practices, in which each investigator must rely on others. The truth-conduciveness of such reliance fails the test of unthinkability of falsehood or mistake, as well as any other Cartesian test, such as clarity and distinctness of “ideas.”