A Priori Knowledge: Toward a Phenomenological Explanation

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Tommaso Piazza, A Priori Knowledge: Toward a Phenomenological Explanation, Ontos, 2007, 193pp., €84.00 (hbk), ISBN 3937202927.

Reviewed by Bosuk Yoon, Ewha Womans University


Skepticism about a priori knowledge has been a dominant attitude within the tradition of analytic philosophy.  The mystery associated with a priori knowledge was in part responsible for the skeptical attitude: a priori knowledge seems to demand a magical power of the mind, called "rational insight", to peer into the necessary properties of the world.  Recently, a number of philosophers have made attempts to rescue a priori knowledge from the skeptical challenge by providing an explanation of how a priori knowledge is possible.  The underlying assumption is that it is possible to save a priori knowledge without appealing to the idea of rational insight.  In this book, however, Tommaso Piazza argues that the assumption is mistaken.  He devotes all but the final chapter to showing that if one is really serious about saving a priori knowledge, then one has to go back and revive the traditional idea of rational insight.  There is no stable position in between skepticism and rational insight.  In the final chapter, Piazza tries to make the idea of rational insight more palatable by developing a Husserlean account of how it might work.

Piazza's challenge to the mainstream views in analytic philosophy is based on a careful and informed analysis of them that, like his phenomenological account of a priori knowledge, contains some original insights and deserves a lengthy discussion for a fuller appreciation.  But has he succeeded in achieving his ultimate goal?  I have some reservations.  In this short review, I will try to delineate for further discussion what I take to be the most controversial issues raised by this book. 

(1) Rational Insight 

Boghossian is certainly not alone when he objects to the idea of a quasi-perceptual faculty of "rational intuition" that is supposed to yield knowledge of the modal properties of the world -- "no one has succeeded in saying what this faculty really is nor how it manages to yield the relevant knowledge".[1]   How does rational insight work?  Piazza explains the method of "eidetic variation" that enables us to see the essence of the Material Thing.  One starts by perceiving or imagining a material object.  One then varies the perceived object, for example, imagining a house without windows or roof.  One judges that the varied object is still a material object.  On the other hand, one can't imagine a material object that is not extended.  From this, one draws the conclusion that extension is a constitutive property.  This variational process allows one to subtract all but those properties that are necessarily part of the essence of material objects -- "By thoroughly performing the variation, then, the Species itself is supposed to emerge" (p.164).

Commenting on the suggestion that we can know a logical truth because we can't conceive or imagine a counter-example to it, Boghossian says that conceiving or imagining here is not really a non-inferential capacity to detect a logical or necessary property, but "a thin disguise for a certain familiar style of logical reasoning".  Boghossian talks about the example of "all bachelors are unmarried".  The claim that we can't conceive a counter-example to such a general claim is really based on the following reasoning: If someone is a bachelor, then he is an unmarried male.  If someone is an unmarried male, then he is unmarried.  Therefore, any bachelor would have to be unmarried.

Piazza may respond by pointing out that although imagination is related to propositional reasoning, they are not identical.  In imagining a melody, one can imagine variations on it, compare two notes in the melody, tap its beat, and so on.   Imaginative ability has the function of engendering all these propositional and practical activities, but none of these is itself necessary for having the ability.  Even if this is so, the crucial question is whether imaginative ability supports all these activities because imagination reveals the modal properties.  For those who follow Berkeley and Hume, to perceive or imagine red is not intellectually to apprehend the essence of red.  Rather, it is to represent a particular shade of red -- "An idea which, considered in itself, is particular, becomes general by being made to represent or stand for all other particular ideas of the same sort."[2]   From this perspective, the very fact that imagination plays such a vital function in our thinking and action explains the illusion that it allows direct access to universals.

Without going further into the problem of how to explicate rational insight, let us ask why the problem should be taken seriously in the first place.

(2) A priori Synthetic

Piazza's main interest in a priori knowledge lies in a priori synthetic knowledge.  Following the tradition of rationalism, Piazza wants to defend the a priori synthetic by refuting empiricism as it is characterized by the thesis that "all knowledge humans can have of the external world stems from, and is justified in light of, the outcome of external experience."  In other words, the target of his criticism is not so much skepticism about the a priori as skepticism about the a priori synthetic.  Rational insight is needed for saving a priori synthetic knowledge.  Those recent theories of the a priori that try to do without rational insight are therefore bound to be criticized.

Yet, it is not clear that recent theories of the a priori that try to do without rational insight are best interpreted as aiming at a defense of empiricism.  Nor is it clear that they necessarily reject the existence of the a priori synthetic.  Contemporary skepticism about the a priori is represented by Quine, and Quine criticized Carnap's distinction between external and internal questions.  According to Carnap, a priori knowledge pertains to the external level, and it is not about reality but entirely dependent on what linguistic framework one adopts.  Quine's criticism of such a picture of a priori knowledge is not based on the premise that a priori knowledge is about reality.  Rather, Quine rejects the very distinction between the external and the internal.  The same considerations that are relevant for settling internal questions are relied on for settling external questions: external and internal questions are on par with each other.  So, those philosophers who try to save a priori knowledge from Quine's attack on it do not have the burden of asserting that a priori knowledge is not about reality.  Instead, they can just focus on the fact that the failure of Carnap's account of the a priori based on the external/internal distinction does not mean that a priori knowledge does not exist.  Their main concern is to explain how we are non-experientially justified in knowing anything.  A recent influential account is the meaning-based account of a priori knowledge that has been defended and developed by Boghossian, Hale, and Wright -- among others.  There are also non-meaning-based accounts.  In this book, Piazza pays most attention to the meaning-based account that exploits the idea of implicit definition.  Notice that even the meaning-based account does not tie a priori knowledge to analyticity so strongly as to rule out the a priori synthetic.  What is demanded of a theory of a priori is that it does not rule out a priori synthetic knowledge.

(3) Objectivity of Logical Truth

Piazza devotes much space to arguing against the view that denies the objectivity of logical truth.  Contra this view, logical truth holds independently of whether we recognize it or not.  On the objectivity of logical truth, however, most researchers seem to fully agree with Piazza.  In rejecting the idea of "true in virtue of meaning", Boghossian and Peacocke, for example, emphasize that a proposition can be known a priori while also being true in virtue of its truth-condition's holding, just like any other truth.[3]  Many philosophers deny the non-factualism about logic according to which there are no facts about logical implication.  At least there is no need to deny that logical truth is true in virtue of a corresponding fact in the world.  The issue here is how it is possible for us to be justified in thinking that modus ponens is valid and necessarily truth-preserving in all its applications. 

On the other hand, Piazza thinks that once the objectivity of logical truth is taken seriously, nothing like implicit definition can provide the needed justification.  If a logical truth holds independently of us, and a priori knowledge of it is possible, then we must have a certain capacity to gain a direct access to the logical fact.  The general principle relied on here is that unless we do have a direct access to the corresponding fact in the world, we necessarily lack a justification.  Jerry Fodor once said, "I see nothing compelling in the inference from 'truth is a matter of correspondence of a belief with the way the world is' to 'ascertaining truth is a matter of 'directly comparing' a belief with the way the world is.'"[4]  In contrast, Piazza finds such an inference compelling: if you are really serious about a correspondence theory of truth, then you can't be content merely with a coherence theory of knowledge.  Let us suppose that Piazza is correct here.  That is, ascertaining the truth of our beliefs can't be a matter of comparing them with each other.  Something other than beliefs -- say, experiences -- have to play some role in justifying our beliefs.  The crucial question is how experiences play such an epistemic role.

(4) Perceptual Justification

Piazza says that Boghossian's argument against rational insight presupposes a causal theory of non-inferential justification, and that the causal theory underlies the empiricist treatment of the notion of perceptual justification (p.139).  Empiricism is tied to the Cartesian picture of the mind for which the mind is presented with something that falls short of a full encounter with the external world.  A given experience is compatible with a number of different hypotheses about the world.  Piazza claims that empiricists have to appeal to something like the causal theory of justification.  The causal theory, however, is basically an externalist account of justification and thus is susceptible to the kind of criticisms given to the externalist account.  The internalist requirement is that the subject must justifiably believe that the method she has been relying on was reliable.  But how is this requirement satisfied?  The causal story that psychologists or neuro-physiologists can tell us, as Piazza points out, is not helpful because their assessment of the reliability of a perceptual mechanism relies on the same perceptual mechanism that is in question.  In this way, empiricists are bound to be led to skepticism or solipsism.  So, it seems that if empiricists are to save their fundamental thesis that experience is one, or even the only, source of knowledge about reality, they must accept that features of the world are given in our inner awareness.  Now, by Piazza's symmetry argument, the same reasoning supports a priori justification as well as perceptual justification -- "the argument could be proposed that an empiricist should either reject perceptual justification, or should accept, together with it, justification supplied by acts of rational insight" (p.148). 

Is Piazza correct in thinking that empiricists have no choice but to accept a causal story of how perceptual justification is possible?  At least one philosopher thinks that the fundamental thesis of classical empiricism can be saved without the causal story.  Anil Gupta has recently argued that although experience alone does not give us justification to believe propositions about the world, it can nonetheless play a rational, not just causal, role in relation to our beliefs.[5]  We surely do learn from experience, but it is by no means obvious what a particular experience says about the world.  Is there a unique propositional content that an experience entitles us to believe?  As Gupta puts it, an experience taken in isolation does not pronounce on how things are.  An experience in itself does not even guarantee that there are such things as sense-data and that I am confronting one of them now.  Experience yields at best conditional entitlement: given such and such a view, one is entitled to such and such judgments.  For example, given my beliefs that my eyes are functioning normally, that light rays are not behaving strangely, and so on, my visual experience of the picture on the wall entitles me to judge that it is tilted.  There is no unique basic proposition that an experience delivers.  Thus, Gupta acknowledges that what perceptual judgment an experience entitles us to make depends on the view that we bring to it.  This, it might be pointed out, is in conflict with the rational role of experience: if what an experience says is what we take it as saying, how can experience be a neutral, unbiased court of appeal?  The given in experience has been traditionally considered as something that an experience has prior to what we take to exist as a result of having it, and Gupta asks us not to place experience in the conceptual realm.  But if what an experience tells one depends on the view that one is antecedently committed to, it seems that there really is nothing given. 

The tension, however, is only apparent.  On Gupta's diagnosis, the tension is generated by the mistaken assumption that if an experience is to make an epistemological contribution, it must have a propositional given.  Instead of the propositional given, Gupta submits an alternative account of the given.  The key idea is that the given in experience is not a proposition, but a function from views to classes of judgments.  A circular definition does not give a categorical verdict on whether something falls under a concept or not.  Nonetheless, it can be informative about the meaning of a word by giving us a rule to revise initial hypotheses about its meaning.  Likewise, experience does not tell us categorically what to believe about the world.  It guides us instead by giving a rule to revise our views.  The denial of the propositional given does not imply that experience plays no rational role.  It is a false dichotomy to say that experience either has a propositional content or else makes no rational contribution. 

Gupta's theory can provide empiricists with an option that may help them to avoid the commitment to the causal theory of perceptual justification.  By the symmetry argument, the empiricist is free to pursue an account of a priori knowledge without appealing to the idea of rational insight.  In order to prevent Gupta's theory from affecting the discussion of a priori justification, the symmetry argument itself should be given up.  If the symmetry is given up, we may even entertain the possibility of direct perceptual justification without direct a priori justification.  In any case, there seems to be a number of different possibilities here that are worth exploring.


Berkeley, G.  A Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge, in The Empricists, Anchor Books, 1974.

Boghossian, P.  "Knowledge of Logic", in New Essays on the A priori, ed. P. Boghossian and C. Peacocke (Oxford University Press, 2000).

Boghossian, P. and Peacocke, C., eds.  New Essays on the A priori, Oxford University Press. 2000.

Fodor, J. Representations, MIT Press, 1981.

Gupta, A. Empiricism and Experience, Oxford University Press, 2006.

[1] Paul Boghossian, “Knowledge of Logic”, p.231.

[2] Berkeley, A Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge, paragraph 12 of the Introduction.

[3] Introduction to New Essays on the A Priori.

[4] Jerry Fodor, Representation, p.242.

[5] Anil Gupta, Empiricism and Experience.