A Process Philosophy of Signs

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James Williams, A Process Philosophy of Signs, Edinburgh University Press, 2016, 199pp., $25.49 (pbk), ISBN 9780748695010.

Reviewed by Michael Halewood, University of Essex


In this book, James Williams develops his own approach to, and understanding of, what constitutes process and how this can be dealt with philosophically. All of this unfolds within a very careful and insightful reconfiguring of the status of signs. This unfolding is one of the most informative and innovative aspects of this work. For, while Williams insists at the start and throughout that he wants to offer a rigorous and robust definition of signs (indeed he talks of a "formal definition"), he does not set out a dogmatic or complete set of axioms or rules at the outset which are to be learned and applied. Instead, although he does provide all the relevant concepts in the Introduction (sets, events, selection, diagrams, intensity, and so on), this is not offered as a complete or sufficient account. Williams makes it clear that the full sense of both his process philosophy and his account of signs will only appear gradually, becoming clearer and richer as his arguments and analyses develop. As a result, it is only though the discussion of different, even opposed, theories of the sign that his own stance will come to the fore. This is an admirable scheme which rewards the patient reader. Some of the different or opposed accounts of the sign that Williams uses to build his argument are those of Wittgenstein, biology, structuralism, semiology, Deleuze and Whitehead. I will not explore all these elements in detail; instead, I want to highlight some of the key elements of this engaged and engaging book.

A recurring theme is that signs should not be considered as only inhering or making sense with the human realm. That is to say, humans may well be involved, immersed even, in the operations of signs, but humans are neither the origin nor the goal of signification. This is an important point and it rescues Williams from having to tread well-worn paths of thought and argument. Allowing animals and other entities to be engaged in the operation of signs--indeed to have and to react to signs--enables a broadening of the scope of the argument. This is not to suggest that Williams simply abolishes any criteria for signs and signification. Quite the opposite. He maintains that his approach is more adequate than others in accounting for all the occasions on which signs arise and are enacted. The adequacy of his approach rests on his definition of a sign as "a selection of a set" (p. 2). The positing of a set represents the formal element of the definition. The notion of selection, in a broad sense, shorn of its reliance upon human agency, represents the process aspect. Despite its apparent "formality", the set of a sign is not fixed or limited. It comes into effect through its selection. Williams argues that the best way of understanding such selections, and their relation to the elements of a set, is though the notion of "diagram". His use of this term is indebted to Deleuze, as is his stress upon the notion of "intensity". This is not, however, a mere rehearsal or borrowing of terms. Williams provides his own slant, and does so, as I have already said, through a discussion of other writers.

Indeed, having set out his general approach to signs (and process), the first substantive chapter turns to a fairly formidable foe: Wittgenstein. Williams devotes much of this chapter to a careful analysis of one of Wittgenstein's "propositions" in his Philosophical Investigations. This is proposition 432, which deals with the question of whether signs are dead until life is somehow breathed into them via (human) use. Williams takes this proposition seriously, returning to the original German text to make his case. There is no simple conflation of use and meaning, as some readers of Wittgenstein have proposed. Instead, Williams' analysis sets the scene for some of the important themes which he will draw out throughout the remaining chapters. These include the need to be able to situate signs in relation to a changing environment (process) while also being able to identify the elements which go to make up the set which is that sign. Being able to maintain both aspects of this argument brings intensity to the fore, for example -- in terms of "an increase or decrease in interest, attention, response, preparedness or other factors" (p. 19). Again, none of these require or presuppose the human as the origin of the sign. Williams remains committed to his initial stance that a full philosophy of the sign cannot be developed by basing signification on the activities of humans alone. Hence, this reading of Wittgenstein conforms to the initial method described at the start of the book, namely, that its arguments will develop in relation to other positions and theories of the sign.

This unfolding of the text is also apparent in the subject matter of the chapter which follows the discussion of Wittgenstein, namely that of signs, biology and life. This is a good example of one of the most notable and commendable aspects of this book, which is that toward the end of each chapter, certain questions seem to arise in the mind of the reader. For example, it might well be the case that we want to extend the activity of signs beyond the human realm, to grant them a life of their own. But what, then, does it mean to say that such signs are alive? What do we mean by life? Williams has organized the text carefully, so that just as such questions are crystallizing, a fuller response is provided in the following chapter. In this instance, the next chapter deals with biology, animals and their signs through a re-reading of Jakob von Uexküll. This includes the important point that while it is crucial for a philosophy of signs to be able to account for their status in relation to the realms of life considered by biology, signs themselves are not natural, in that they are not an object which is subject to discovery by science per se. This discussion of biology, in turn, raises more general questions about the relation of process in philosophy and process in biology, which are the topic of the next chapter, comprising an analysis of Eric Bapteste and John Dupré.

Interestingly, the next chapter, which is situated at the middle of the book, is one which might have been expected to be placed at the start. It is titled "The Sign" and sets out the core of Williams' philosophical approach. Having this chapter at the centre of the book works well. It acts as a fulcrum. The earlier chapters have engaged with a range of different approaches to the sign, as has been seen. At this stage, we are now in a position to revisit the minimal definitions offered in the Introduction and to establish a fuller understanding of a process philosophical approach to the sign as itself a process. Crucially, this does not deny the roles of signification or reference which are so important to competing theories of the sign. It does, however, deny that they are sufficient in themselves to account for the complexity of signs and their operations, in relation to a changing environment. Hence: 'the process version draws the signifier and signified into a much wider web of changing intensities of relations represented by a suite of diagrams without which the process sign will be incomplete' (p. 81).

It is in light of this that Williams turns to structuralism, semiology and, most particularly, the work of Roland Barthes. This reading emphasizes how process is already present in Barthes' account but needs broadening and re-situating. Again, Williams does not try to refute the positions that he discusses, but to reorient them, in order to make them more effective, more fruitful, in light of his process philosophical approach. The key target of Williams' critique is semiology and structuralism's reduction of signs to 'specific languages and forms of speech, to external matter and social use' (p. 107). In contrast, Williams wants to extend the limits of, the argument and this widening of scope constitutes the metaphysical aspect of his argument, as is made explicit in the subsequent chapter on Deleuze and Whitehead.

Having raised the question of metaphysics, it is important to note that Williams is quite wary, if not of the term, then of the implications of the term. That is to say, Williams is not attempting to provide a "theory of everything". It becomes clearer, at this stage, that, unlike Deleuze, his aim is to provide a localized account; this is what he means by a philosophy of signs. 'My approach is minimalist and locally pragmatic. A speculative philosophy should involve no more metaphysical concepts than are needed to establish the sign as a process' (p. 142). Furthermore: 'The process philosophy of signs is ambivalent about universal applicability' (p. 148). This situates Williams, and his philosophy, in a different lineage to that of Deleuze and Whitehead. Williams feels that process philosophy, considered as one which advocates process as the explanation of all that is, or could be, runs the risk of explaining away rather than providing a surer mode of explicating the status and role of signs within existence.

I may, ultimately, have some reservations about the reading of Whitehead offered at this point but I am very sympathetic to the thrust of Williams' argument. The invocation or recourse to process as some kind of catch-all explanation is not helpful; in fact, it can be obfuscatory. Throughout this thoughtful book, Williams manages to avoid such accusations and by limiting and localizing his account to a treatment of signs manages to produce a coherent and convincing account which offers a real contribution, one in which 'the wind makes sense' (p. 46).