This is a very important book and quite an extraordinary one. Some years ago, a colleague of mine began a review with a sentence that I have always wanted to use myself: "if I had written this book, I would die a happy man." The sentiment expressed by this sentence, that the book being reviewed has about it a kind of greatness and worth such that authoring it could easily count as the culmination of a fully worthwhile life, is one that I admit to feeling about Charles Taylor's monumental work A Secular Age. Taylor of course is well-known for his books on psychological explanation, Hegel, communitarian political philosophy, ethics and moral philosophy, and much else. Arguably he is one of the most influential English- language philosophers of the past half century. The scope of his thought is impressive -- history, political theory, ethics and moral philosophy, art, epistemology, and religion. But more to the point, it is the special way in which Taylor has bridged the gap between continental and analytic philosophy that is important and the way that in the course of bridging that gap he has shaped an historically rich and philosophically powerful conception of the modern identity and its social and cultural matrices.
The current work is a much-expanded version of Taylor's Gifford Lectures and a natural successor to his earlier book Sources of the Self. In that book, Taylor identified the major features of our moral-political-religious identity in the Western world and showed how those features developed and crystallized out of various historical processes. He also framed the demands of such an identity broadly in terms of what he there called "moral sources" in order to display various modern options for what empowers and inspires our moral sensibilities. I am convinced, moreover, that in that work Taylor ultimately endorses the ways in which a religious moral source can and should be called upon to satisfy our needs as moral and political selves in the modern world. In the end, that is, Sources of the Self is both an exploration of who we are as modern selves and an apology for an ethics that refers to transcendence and is religious, and specifically Christian in spirit.
But the focus of Sources of the Self is ethical and political, even if its conclusions, as I read it, are spiritual and religious, even if, that is, it argues that only a transcendent moral source is sufficient to inspire and empower the moral order that we in fact occupy. This is where A Secular Age constitutes a supplement to the earlier work. In the new book Taylor explores the religious -- and specifically the Christian -- character of our age and the various options available to believers and non-believers in our time. Moreover, not only does he provide a narrative of how these options arose and developed, from 1500 to the present, but he also examines the challenges they face and the dialectical ways in which these options are related to their cultural and political context, our needs and values, and one another. In the course of this account, furthermore, Taylor occasionally identifies his own proclivities and commitments, his own receptivity to transcendence and engagement with the historical, cultural, and political challenges we all face. Along the way, of course, we are introduced to a variety of ideal types of religious and non-religious ways of life, but this is no disinterested scholarly inquiry, no disengaged charting of territory or classification. It is rather an elaborate and committed mapping of territory for inhabitants by a co-inhabitant and a restrained eulogy to a particular domicile by one who occupies it. A Secular Age is a philosophical paean to one form of Christian moral and political life.
A number of things make Taylor's book remarkable. First, it addresses what is perhaps the major problematic of philosophy, ethics, and religion of the past century and a half. This is the problem of the content and foundations of moral value and all that such value involves, the problem that can be taken to be one of the issues addressed by Nietzsche's famous claim that God is dead. In the wake of Kant, Fichte, Hegel, Marx, and Kierkegaard, what is the most compelling account of what makes life valuable and what is the normative status of this way of life? What is it that grounds our sense of obligation, that inspires us to affirm and commit our lives to certain values, and that empowers or motivates us to realize such commitments? As Taylor suggests, after the Enlightenment and the 18th century, the most attractive solutions to this question lie in nature, as a form of natural sympathy or set of natural desires or interests, or in our sense of human dignity grounded in our rational agency, or in some kind of transcendence. The problem of Taylor's recent works, the present book included, is this set of challenges and the way it has implications for our sense of what is worthwhile or valuable in human life, what matters to us, and why. As we look back on the past century of philosophy, we can read the work of Wittgenstein, Heidegger, Quine, Davidson, Williams, Rawls, Habermas, Putnam, Cavell and a host of others as contributions to this problematic. Taylor sees this issue, and his work, importantly inspired by Hegel and Foucault among so many, is just such a contribution.
Second, what distinguishes Taylor's recent books, as it does the work of Alasdair MacIntyre ever since After Virtue, is the way it lacks any kind of provinciality. In short, it is not biased against a religious response to this problematic. Indeed, it is unabashedly willing to defend a religious solution or a religious commitment, and a Christian one, albeit a nuanced and distinctive one. To be sure, other analytic philosophers have recently taken on rather strong Christian commitments but largely within the framework of a kind of natural theology. What distinguishes Taylor and MacIntyre is that both take on Christian commitments within the framework of a moral order or within the larger question of what might be called a hermeneutics of human life and its evaluative richness.
Third, Taylor's work is informed and nuanced, pluralist, deep, open, and yet critical. He frames questions in such a way that they are highly abstract and yet richly concrete, and his discussion of positions and issues is broad and yet filled with detail. What marks Taylor's style, as a philosopher, is that he sets out novel and wide conceptual frameworks and yet illustrates them with encounters that are detailed and subtle. This is why I say that Taylor is indebted to predecessors like Hegel and Foucault, both of whose work is narrative, exploratory, and yet conceptual, all at once. In today's vocabulary, I suppose, we might call his work genealogical, but perhaps it is clearer simply to describe it as conceptually articulate and yet historically full, narrative and dialectical. If this is what we mean by genealogical, then Taylor's work is that.
It is time to say something about the plot of the book. Although it is divided into five parts and twenty chapters, I think that we can best understand the book as having two parts, a diachronic or narrative one and a dialectical or synchronic one. In the first four parts and fourteen chapters, Taylor charts the historical development that led to the main option that makes our secular age possible, what he calls "exclusive humanism," and then describes its diverse legacy in the 19th century to our own day. In the last part and final six chapters, he uses these results in order to explore several current options of belief and unbelief in their interrelations and especially in terms of how they deal with suffering and evil, the bodily and the sexual, violence and destruction, the mundane and the variety of ordinary life.
Taylor's historical narrative is marked by several features. First, it is not a history of doctrines or theories. Rather it is a history of the background conditions that made various doctrinal and practical ways of life possible and hence is framed as a history of lived experience, what Taylor calls the "social imaginaries" of lived experience, or what might be called a history of sensibilities or worldviews, of the self-understandings of our social existence (146, 171-174). Second, Taylor's account avoids "homogenizing" these social imaginaries of experience and tries to appreciate their complexity. Third, Taylor emphasizes that one of the most important shifts in these background frameworks as lived, these social imaginaries, is when they cease to be oriented around elites and become explicitly open to all human beings. They become the frameworks of belief and life for whole societies. Fourth, time and again Taylor eschews what he calls "subtraction stories," which narrate the development of secularity as the formulation of a view that emerges by subtracting one or more features of transcendence from the view and thereby freeing us from illusions or limitations that confine and distort who we are. His own approach seeks to show how various forms of belief and unbelief interact with their social and religious context and with one another in ways that are constantly giving rise to new forms of belief and unbelief. Taylor's story does not treat the history of Christianity in the West as a story, perhaps indebted to Marx or Nietzsche or Freud, from darkness to light, from infantile piety to an adult form of secular humanism, one in which a conception of a morally ordered society under divine governance realizes a more perfect state when its references to transcendence are subtracted from it (see 22, 91, 255, 573). Finally, Taylor explicitly confines his account to a history of secularism as it arises within the life of Christendom in the West. Although he does, on a few occasions, refer to Islam and Judaism, the book is an account of the current age in the life of Christianity in the world of North Atlantic civilizations. By and large, the theologians, texts, authors, philosophers, political figures, poets, and others whom he discusses are Christian or are figures whose lives and work can be understood within the context of Christian culture in the West. Taylor does say that analogous accounts could be given for secularity within other religious worlds; he does not indicate or suggest how these other accounts might be similar to or different from his own.
To sketch the main features of Taylor's historical narrative is not a simple task, I think, in part because of the complexity of the story that Taylor tells and in part because of the terminology he uses. Taylor explores a myriad of themes in analysis that begin in one place, only to pick up the same theme on several different occasions, weaving in an intermittent way patterns that gain in depth and clarity only as the book goes on. The book is filled too with digressions, or perhaps it is more precise to say that its structure is not linear but rather investigative and exploratory. Taylor bridles against simple, straightforward analyses or narratives, and the result is that it is very hard to identify the main lines of his story or even to summarize the development of its main themes and ideas. This complexity, then, poses one sort of problem for any attempt to summarize the book's content.
Years ago, when Taylor was working on Sources of the Self, he and I had lunch together in Montreal, and he tried to explain to me the conceptual apparatus that he was developing for discussing the ethical and moral realities that he discusses in that book. I remember vividly how challenging he thought it was to formulate and then define terms and concepts that were embracing enough and sufficiently unbiased for the task. In A Secular Age one senses the same kind of struggle going on, especially when Taylor tries to clarify what he means by secularization, what he takes to be the object of his narrative and his account, and the kind of life and the kind of experience he takes to be the most revealing setting in which the crucial features of a person's lived experience are disclosed. The latter he calls "fullness," but this term is obscured as much as clarified by its commonness.
Taylor talks often about experiencing fullness and how it is in such an experience that the character of an age's ideals and their capacity to inspire and empower a person are revealed. "Fullness" characterizes a momentary experience when what counts most about a way of life and a conception of what matters in life is conveyed to the agent in a particularly complete and perfect way (see 600-601). Hence, for a believer, Taylor says, fullness is experienced as received, while for non-believers, especially after the 18th century, fullness is experienced as grounded or empowered by something that lies within us, say reason or certain forms of desire (see, e.g., 9). Moreover, although there comes a time when such ideals of life are conceived of as available to every Christian, still they may be best articulated by members of an elite -- by statesmen or philosophers or saints or poets -- because they are most capable of expressing the experience of such fullness in a way that reveals its dimensions and its character and because they are most likely to have done so. For this reason, Taylor's story not only refers to social and political practices and events, and to psychological responses and habits, but also to its main illustrative expositors, so to speak, who are philosophers, novelists, poets, the authors of confessional literature, and such, for they are the people who have left us literary evidence of what they experienced at moments when they lived in a moment of fullness and then sought to articulate its meaning and character. I mention all of this not to try to clarify what Taylor means by "fullness" or to register qualms about the term or its use. My point is that Taylor's narrative is made all the more complex by the fact that he is trying to deal with a subject matter that is not that easy to conceptualize and in ways that are also not that easy to clarify. He develops and employs a terminology, and he has to, at least as a kind of shorthand, but it may be that the meaning of his vocabulary only becomes clearer and more accessible as the book goes on and that the terms may themselves have a good deal of ambiguity or nuance. The terms he uses are by and large an embedded vocabulary that is hard to disengage from the particular contexts in which it is used.
With this caveat in place, let me try to outline the story that Taylor tells. How do we get from a closed, hierarchical order governed by the divine, an enchanted world inhabited by demons, forces, magic and so forth and the home of what Taylor calls the "porous" self, to a disenchanted, mechanistic world inhabited by the disengaged or " buffered" self? How does the world change from one in which the power of fullness lies outside of us and nature to one in which that power lies within us, from a world organized around "higher times" to one in which time is largely homogeneous and empty? And then how does this latter world become our own, and when it does, what opportunities become available for ways of experiencing that world and living in it?
According to Taylor, the modern, secular world emerges when an internal and self-sufficient humanism becomes available as a real opportunity, a humanism with no goal other than some form of human flourishing. Resources for such a self-sufficient or, (as Taylor calls it) an exclusive humanism, become available at least in the 16th and 17th centuries -- with the rise of the new science and all it implies with a new sense of the self, its depths and its status as disengaged with the world as an observer, analyst, and critic, and with a new appreciation for ordinary life and the mundane. These changes were all guided by a Reform spirit in Christianity, of which the Reformation was a high point insofar as it focused on dissolving the gap between elite and popular piety. But such a humanism itself only begins to emerge in the Enlightenment and to come of age in the 19th century. When it does, this exclusive humanism is marked by agency that is active and constructive and by a conception of social order that is grounded in science, art, and morality. What occurs is a shift from finding our place in the cosmos to constructing our position in the universe (114). In both there is order, but in the former the order is God-given and permanent, while in the latter the order is shaped by human effort to remake human life and transform society (125).
Taylor gives priority of place to the natural law tradition, the rise of neo-Stoicism, and the way in which the Cartesian revolution provided the notion of disengaged agency that could seek to transform society according to an ideal of order that is grounded in divine providence. Lipsius, the creator of neo-Stoicism, was committed to the human capacity to unify society through active intervention in public, political, and military affairs (117-118). He had advice for absolute sovereigns whose goal was political peace and security in the face of conflict and war. Exclusive humanism developed out of this combination of neo-Stoicism, the natural law tradition, and the contract tradition of Grotius and Locke (130). In the wake of the Cartesian revolution, society came to be viewed as a malleable substance that could be shaped by the human imposition of ideal form. That ideal was an ideal of moral order, first conceived as a harmony of interests and then as security for individual rights and the creation of freedom, and finally as a network of mutual benefit whereby individuals are organized in society in order to help one another (see 171). In this development, the American Revolution was a watershed, for it heralded the coming of a nation constituted by human agency without a real vertical grounding in a transcendent source.
Roughly speaking, exclusive humanism is a development of the 18th and 19th centuries. But it was anticipated by developments of the late 16th and 17th centuries. What, then, formed the transition to it? Taylor's answer is providential Deism. It is this intermediate stage that made exclusive humanism a live option. It was a form of natural religion that conceived of the world as an impersonal order that focused on mutual benefit and was designed by God (221). What distinguishes Deism are a number of shifts: one serves God in no other way than by serving humankind; understanding nature and living in it are projects governed by reason; any sense of mystery and miracle diminishes (222-224). Taylor surveys many reasons for such changes and the narrowing of religiosity to morality -- historical, cultural, and political reasons. But the crucial point is that in Deism the divine or transcendent orientation of Christian life is severely attenuated, leaving Christianity one step away from an immanent humanism. In Deism, God is the overseer of an impersonal natural order, is nearly dispensable, and, as Taylor puts it, in Deism man's only vocation is human flourishing (242-243). It is but a short step to the kind of humanism that Taylor associates with Kant, Bentham, and Mill.
Exclusive humanism invokes a moral order whose ontic commitment, as Taylor calls it, is wholly intra-human; it carries no reference to transcendence (256). According to it, we are motivated either by enlightenment or by a sense of natural sympathy, and our aim is benevolence. It is one of the special achievements of such humanism that it discloses these new, anthropocentric moral sources by which we are motivated and empowered to accomplish mutual benefit (257). It is the province of the buffered self, disengaged and the locus of dignity, freedom, discipline, and a sense of human capability (262).
Hence, by the early 19th century, exclusive humanism developed as an alternative to Christian faith in a personal God and an order of miracles and mystery. It had positive and negative features, giving rise to a sense of pride and self-worth but also to a feeling of being limited by this world and of being alienated from something valuable and decisive. Out of this tension there arose a sense of malaise in a world that seemed empty and barren. And from this malaise sprang a host of further developments in belief and unbelief -- Taylor calls this the nova effect -- and finally, during the twentieth century, a proliferation of the fractured worlds of an intellectual elite to whole societies (299). The 19th and 20th centuries, then, are scenes of instability and uncertainty, for poets and philosophers, and eventually for whole peoples and societies, who experience ennui and a pervasive meaninglessness. Taylor surveys the many dimensions of such changes and the proliferation of modes of unbelief and responses to them in the 19th century; he features, among others, literary figures, artists, and poets whose work expresses the melancholy and despair that grip the age. It is a time of unbelief for some and of novel ontic commitments, albeit not religious ones, for others, a time of wonder, play, mystery, and even horror (374-376). It is this period that provides us now with our possibilities for belief and the shape or shapelessness of our world.
Of special importance for understanding the current situation are the changes associated with the 1960s, the growth of widespread "expressive" individualism as a social movement, and changes in the conception of agency and the good (Chapter 13, "The Age of Authenticity"). With the return of a vital youth culture and the development of a consumer society, together with a host of other social and economic changes, this new culture recovers in its own way trends that Taylor associates with Romanticism but now as a mass movement (and not the special province of an artistic and literary elite) with its focus on fashion, style, external display, the protection of rights, and much more. Of all of this, Taylor asks: where in the culture of expressive individualism is the sacred? (486) To answer this very difficult question Taylor explores a whole variety of modalities of contemporary culture, their roots in the previous two centuries, their relationship to traditional religious practices and commitments. He concludes that in some ways post-1960s generations are deeply alienated from traditional forms of Christian faith in the West, often opposing such forms and often recovering them but only in rigid, exaggerated ways. But one should not see the past fifty years, pure and simply, as a time of the breakdown of a sense of the sacred. Rather new forms of spirituality have developed, new senses of the sacred set in new languages (507). There have emerged new struggles for wholeness and spiritual health, new paths to what Taylor has called all along "fullness." The upshot is a tension in our day of the rejection of traditional religious life in favor of individualism and pluralism and the affirmation of forms of it, between those who affirm traditional authority and those who reject it (510), those who are driven to new forms of self-sufficiency. Furthermore, what marks our spiritual landscape is great diversity and the proliferation of middle ways, between these two poles, of ways of unbelief and ways of belief. This spells a decline in Christendom perhaps, but not a decline in Christianity, conceived in broad and nuanced terms. Taylor calls this a diffusive Christianity, a believing without belonging (518-519). What has been lost is not the religious motivation; rather it is a commitment to traditional belief and practice. There has been a decline not in religious aspiration and its prominence but rather in the unchallengeable status of belief (530). We are in a new age of religious searching. At a time when morality seems to be a matter of utility, rationality, and freedom, it may be hard to see why anyone feels the need to ground morality in something higher, in divine transcendence, but, Taylor argues, religious answers to the question of life's meaning are still available, and, to some, such answers are desirable (591-592).
This sketch is culled largely from Parts I-IV (Chapters 1-14) of A Secular Age. As Taylor puts it at the beginning of Chapter 15, these earlier chapters tell the story of how we arrived at the question. Why is it so hard to believe in God in the modern West, when in 1500 it was virtually impossible not to believe? (539) The reader should be warned, however, that the story is not an easy read. Taylor as a narrator seems to be constantly constrained by a resistance to the linear and the simplistic; at times his forward movement occurs almost under duress. For every step forward in his story, Taylor provides dozens of side-trips or repetitions of strands of the story from new points of view, or explorations of positions, figures, responses, and conditions from alternative perspectives. We might better appreciate these chapters of the book if we see them as arguments for complexity and nuance, with the story of the emergence and diversification of exclusive humanism embedded within them. Indeed, here is where the richness of the book occurs, and it is something that no review or report could possibly convey. Neither is it an uncontroversial story nor are its overarching arguments, its various digressions, its subplots and sub-subplots uncontroversial. If we are persuaded, however, it is a story that provides the resources for an analysis of the contemporary West.
Part V (Chapters 15-20) gives an account of the "spiritual shape of the present age." Here Taylor draws upon the terminology, conceptual apparatus, and results of the earlier chapters in order to conduct a kind of structural-dialectical analysis of the complexity of our current age, a time in which a host of spiritual and anti-spiritual options for Christians interact and vie with one another and with the historical context of the age. The dramatis personae who have been introduced earlier -- disenchantment, the porous and buffered selves, the modern moral order, exclusive humanism, higher time and secular time, the paleo-, neo-, and post-Durkheimian dispensations, et al. -- and a number of new players (for example, the "immanent frame," the "ancien regime" and the "closed world structures," and an array of cross pressures) now come on stage in a series of dramatic engagements, like a repertoire company performing a variety show. In an earlier episode, for example, these players show how we live today in an "immanent frame" that is disenchanted and humanistic. This frame is the sensed context in which we live and develop our beliefs. It is a Wittgensteinian picture, a background for our thinking that we most often take for granted but in which we can at times feel the pull of beliefs in one direction or another (548-549). The players show that this immanent frame need not require that a sense of the sacred be rejected. They then go on to ask how this frame can remain open (544-545), even if today many features of it push us toward closure. After numerous such episodes, at the very end, Taylor as impresario allows himself to call on stage several exemplars of the kind of Christian faith that Taylor himself finds most compelling -- Ivan Illich, Charles Peguy, and Gerard Manley Hopkins -- and in his farewell to the reader, to celebrate the future as a time of opportunity and not one of despair.
One of the central themes that recurs in these last chapters, having been introduced earlier, concerns the ways in which belief and unbelief cope with a cluster of realities -- ordinary life, the body, sexuality, violence, suffering, pain, evil, and such. If these realities are intended to be grouped together, it is nonetheless difficult to grasp how the category they constitute should be defined. What is the polarity of which these realities are intended to occupy one pole? Is it the opposition between the abstract and the concrete? Or that between the mental and the physical? Or between the sacred and the profane? Or the transcendent and the immanent? Or eternity and time? Between spiritual transformation and a wholly worldly human flourishing? In a sense, the polarity is none of these in any narrow way; it is all of them in a broad sense.
Taylor argues that the salient feature of Western societies is not a decline in religious belief and practice; it is rather the plurality of forms of belief and unbelief and their fragile or transitory status. We live in a world of what he calls "cross pressures" where the old beliefs and views are destabilized and new ones have formed and especially where middle positions take shape or are transformed (595). Novel forms of spiritual life take shape between orthodox religiosity and atheistic materialism and as a result of these cross pressures. The latter give rise to various dilemmas which we face in various ways. The realities to which I refer above are a cluster that forms one side of these cross pressures and one pole of such dilemmas (see especially Chapters 17 and 18). Often Christianity has gone through stages or taken up views that involve what Taylor calls "excarnation," a shift from taking seriously the bodily, the sexual, the physical, and such to giving priority of place to what lies in the head, e.g., reason or psychological well-being or spiritual transformation. But at critical moments there emerged forms of belief and unbelief that sought to recover the sense of the bodily and its importance; Taylor frequently cites the case of Schiller and his notion of "play" as well as more extreme figures from the Romantics and Nietzsche to Bataille (see 609-617). There are a host of more traditional forms of belief and unbelief, moreover, that also seek to cope with these realities.
The aspiration to fullness or wholeness includes the aspiration to rescue or rehabilitate the bodily and the domain of natural, ordinary desires (618). A full human life must somehow deal with our incarnate status, whether by affirming it, denying its significance, or in some middle way. As Taylor shows, the domain of the physical and ordinary makes a variety of demands upon moral positions and upon Christianity, and both ethics and religion have sought to cope with these challenges and to incorporate the bodily, the sexual, and the ordinary in a variety of ways. Taylor's account amounts to his particular way of articulating what is well-known and occasionally to his framing a widely-appreciated set of issues in a novel way or to calling attention to what is not all that frequently discussed. The classical model for this discussion is Platonic, for the category to which Taylor is here calling attention can be initially understood as a set of variations on Plato's portrayal of life in the world of everyday experience, the world of "becoming," of change and instability. Hence, the challenges that are posed for religion and ethics, insofar as they seek fullness and perfection, are the challenges of time and history, of the physical and mundane, of desire and pain and erotic love, of injury, pain, violence, and suffering, and much else along these lines, including their natural fulfillments as well as fragile character. Taylor is as interested in health and human flourishing as he is in sickness and evil intention.
In Chapter 17 Taylor uses this set of realities and the problems it poses for belief and unbelief in order to map some positions that are available today. They are used, for example, by non-believers in critiques of Christianity. One critique is Romantic; it charges Christianity with trying to escape the limitations of our finite human condition. Drawing on Martha Nussbaum, Taylor points out that this effort smacks of "changing the subject," insofar as it chooses to fulfill human life by aiming to transcend it altogether. "Are we not forsaking human excellence and striving after some alien life-form?" (626) But there is
another charge against the aspiration to transcend, not just that it is futile and self-defeating, but that it actually damages us, unfits us for the pursuit of human fulfillment … . By inducing in us hate and disgust at our ordinary human desires and neediness … a repulsion at our limitations which poisons the joy we might otherwise feel in the satisfactions of human life as it is. (626)
Taylor notes that this charge is especially made against Christianity, not only by Nussbaum but before her by thinkers such as Voltaire and Nietzsche. But Taylor calls our attention to this argument. First, it fails to appreciate how often and how importantly Christianity itself demanded a return to the ordinary and the "rediscovery and affirmation of important human goods" (628). What he is calling attention to is the way that in religious and literary, as well as social, contexts there has been in modernity a renewed appreciation of everyday (even flawed) relationships, conduct, and experiences, from love to estrangement, from animosity to mutual concern. In short, no form of transformation is acceptable that eschews what is human in our lives, and not all forms of transcendence are completely valuable; it is not all that clear what forms of transcendence are desirable and what forms are not, nor can we be certain at all times about what in human life ought to be transcended and what should not (630). There is too much complexity in sexual love, violence, and even suffering for categorical, completely confident judgments. In the end, Taylor encourages us to worry about crediting too seriously the distinction between the immanent and the transcendent as they occur in this kind of critique of Christianity (632).
As I see it, however, there is another way to make this kind of case against critics like Nussbaum and Nietzsche, not because no clear line divides the immanent from the transcendent, but because even when there is such a line, it may not be possible to cross it. One might be inclined to believe that there is a kind of violence, suffering, or evil that is so extreme, so radical, that it is always worth transcending although in some sense it is never possible to do so. Such a radical evil, to be taken seriously, must be acknowledged for what it is -- wholly evil, such that transcending it would risk treating it as an opportunity or motivation for bettering oneself through escape. The only alternative, then, would be to oppose it, to resist it, leaving open how that might be done in a way that does not risk turning the evil itself into a good or succumbing to it.
If one form of Christianity sought to transcend the body, suffering, violence, and evil, another form, more humanistic, failed to appreciate the depth and seriousness of the latter. It was criticized too, but this time not by a humanistic responsibility to the everyday but rather, on the one hand, by those who celebrated violence, aggression, and desire to inflict suffering -- once again, it is Nietzsche who comes to Taylor's mind (634-635) -- and, on the other, by those who believe that "this humanism tends to hide from itself how great the conflict is between the different things we value" and "artificially removes the tragedy, the wrenching choices between incompatibles, the dilemmas, which are inseparable from human life" (635); here it is Isaiah Berlin and Bernard Williams whom Taylor mentions. For both such positions, an "untroubled harmony" is "unattainable" and "even a kind of culpable weakness" (635). Here too, however, Taylor finds the critique at times unjustified and yet also, in other cases, wholly appropriate. But oddly enough it is the very same humanism that charges Christianity with an unacceptable disregard of the human that is itself now charged with too compromised a harmony with it.
Taylor's analysis does not end here, but it is sufficient for us to see the point of his dialectical, ramified exploration of positions: it is to demonstrate that the map of possibilities for belief and unbelief in our age is not a simple one, not even one of basic oppositions. Instead what is needed, as he himself says, is a "new, more nuanced map of the ideological terrain" (626), and it is to further that task that the remainder of Chapters 17 and 18 is designed. It is a project organized around what he calls the "maximal demand," to examine "how to define our highest spiritual or moral aspirations for human beings, while showing a path to the transformation involved which doesn't crush, mutilate or deny what is essential to our humanity" (639-640). And the ultimate ground of this demand, he claims, is our aspiration to wholeness. To be sure, Taylor admits that not all see this aspiration in the same terms or in the same way; Plato and Aristotle may both adhere to it and yet with very different interpretations. But he does claim that it is central to a Christianity whose central affirmation is the Incarnation of the divine in the human. This is a very Hegelian commitment on Taylor's part, and there is little surprise in his making it.
Moreover, embedded in the belief in the Incarnation is a commitment to the union of the sacred and the profane, the infinite and the finite, that does show how profoundly Christian Taylor's analysis is. One need only note that Judaism, for all its own commitment to some kind of unity in nature and society, is not grounded in the affirmation of a similar unity of the divine and the human. For Judaism, when the infinite encounters the finite in moments of revelation, it is crucial that both retain their utter independence and that the covenant between them is dialectically rich but also respects their fundamental difference. Can the same be said of the ideals of eternity and the realities of history, of redemption and human fulfillment? Or is the distinction between transcendence and immanence, fundamentally, so different for Judaism that the maximal demand need be met but only in a very different way than it must in Christianity?
I raise these questions only to suggest something that I think Taylor would himself accept, that his story of secularization in the Christian West has its peculiar, distinctive features that may influence but might not carry over without alteration to a story about secularization and Jewish life in the West or secularization and Islam in the West -- and also in the East. That is, rich and suggestive as it is, Taylor's narrative and his analysis is by no means the end of the story of religion and Western culture. Indeed, I think that he is careful never to suggest that, even if his story were completed in all its details, it would be such a comprehensive picture. But Taylor's story and his analysis do raise fundamental and extremely important questions that deserve to be addressed and they do so in provocative and challenging ways. I have tried to say enough about the content of A Secular Age to show why this is so; I leave detailed criticism to the reader. It is a book that no one interested in religion, philosophy, ethics, politics, and art in Western society and culture can afford to neglect.