A Sense of the World: Essays on Fiction, Narrative, and Knowledge

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John Gibson, Wolfgang Huemer, and Luca Pocci (eds.), A Sense of the World: Essays on Fiction, Narrative, and Knowledge, Routledge, 2007, 344pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415701914.

Reviewed by Allen Speight, Boston University


Much has been written about the "ancient quarrel" between philosophy and poetry – as has, by extension, the broader "quarrel" between philosophy and literature. Neither is, of course, in any sense a single-issue quarrel: from Plato alone stem epistemological and ontological debates about the status of images and the activity of mimēsis, ethical and political concerns over the emotional appeal of particular literary genres, as well as theological and philosophical arguments about the nature of good, evil and the gods as represented by literary works.

The editors of this welcome volume have taken as their particular focus the question of literature's cognitive potential: whether and in what sense there is knowledge to be gained from our encounter with works of literary fiction. Stated in these terms, as Noël Carroll acknowledges in the second of this volume's essays, the question may strike non-philosophers as having an entirely obvious answer: of course we learn from literature, of course novelists, dramatists and poets expand our understanding of ourselves and the world.

But there are many ways of expressing that immediate conviction about literature's cognitive potential that have given pause to philosophers -- both those who would be delighted to have poetry and literary artists in their city and those who wouldn't. Is there, for example, something which deserves to be called artistic truth? Is the knowledge involved propositional knowledge or not? And, if there is knowledge or truth of some sort "in" literary works, does it result from essential features of those works and is it the product of the intentional aims of their authors?

The editors have wisely avoided an overly narrow construal of the cognitive issues that literature raises: in the widest sense, as John Gibson puts it in the volume's introduction, the concern is with "the relationship between life and literature itself" or "the worldly interest we take in the literary work of art." The twenty-two essays in the volume (only three of which appear to have been published previously) do have a wide and healthy variety of perspectives on how literature confronts, creates or appropriates the world. The volume's four-part organizational structure -- "Knowledge through Literary Fiction," "Narrating Worlds and Selves," "The Poetic, the Dramatic and the Real," and "Imagination, Objectivity and Culture" -- allows for some of the related issues involved here to be grouped together, but there is actually a much deeper cross-connection among many of the essays than this structure may first make apparent. Many of the essays address in some way, for example, the issue of fictionality and truth, in particular what has been called the "paradox of fiction": how can we respond (emotionally, intelligently) to literary characters and situations if what we are encountering are simply objects of make-believe?

The initial essays by Peter Lamarque ("Learning from Literature") and Carroll ("Literary Realism, Recognition and the Communication of Knowledge") acknowledge the debt that this conversation in general owes to the ancient framework of the Platonic-Aristotelian debate about poetry and imitation: are there "opportunities for learning" that are "integral" to fiction, as Lamarque asks? Lamarque takes the skeptical position that there is no "essential feature" of the practice of literature that results in (non-fictional) beliefs or knowledge. In response, Carroll argues that it is not required that every work of art enable a reader to learn something, but if at least some works do (Carroll gives as an example realist fiction) then the skeptical position will not be able to get off the ground. Carroll acknowledges that realist fiction is just one genre with which to begin, and the volume takes up the claim more widely: A.D. Nuttall argues that even works of fantasy such as Lewis Carroll's Alice in Wonderland may involve some "representation" of reality, and there are similar explorations in the cases of lyric poetry by Eileen John ("Poetry and Cognition"), dramatic poetry by Charles Altieri ("Wonder in the Winter's Tale: A Cautionary Tale of Epistemic Criticism") and self-referential mirroring or "playfulness" in literature by Brian McHale ("En abyme: Internal Models and Cognitive Mapping").

One difficulty with the frame of this initial debate is the tendency to put the question about literature's cognitive potential in a way that renders the reader oddly passive: is it an essential feature of literature that it impart knowledge or beliefs? can literature deliver or communicate anything of epistemological value? Such a passive stance about the supposed role of the reader is critically addressed in the contributions of Luca Pocci and Richard Eldridge, both of whom share a stress on the essential hermeneutical activity of the reader and the question of what it means for a work to be about something for a reader or to have a theme.

A second difficulty is with what sort of knowledge may be involved and at what level of generality. An important suggestion in this regard comes from Catherine Z. Elgin ("The Laboratory of the Mind"), who claims that literary artists are often engaged in a kind of "thought-experiment" (not, she stresses, as "austere" as those in philosophical ethics or as "beholden to fixed background assumptions" as those in the natural sciences). The results yielded by such thought-experiments in the best kinds of literary work are not, she claims, banal generalizations but more concrete truths of the sort that might emerge from what Jane Austen characterized as the typical focus of her novels: "three or four families in a country village is the very thing to work on." It is true that many literary artists of merit are terrific at concrete exemplification of salient details but notoriously bad at philosophical generalization. What reader has not wanted to urge an aesthetic amputation of Tolstoy's "Second Epilogue" to War and Peace? Yet few would be so quick to do the same with the generalization in the first sentence of Anna Karenina, and clearly at least some literature aspires to at least the level of generalization reflected in Aristotle's remark in the Poetics that tragedy is about happiness and unhappiness (as opposed to the even more abstract descriptions involved in sketching character-types). As though to emphasize the difficulty, Elgin's essay is immediately followed by two essays that concern what we might term the problem of the incomprehensible singular: Bernard Harrison's essay on the moral and epistemological questions raised by examples of Holocaust fiction and Susan L. Feagin's essay on characters and actions that defy understanding. Real-world acts of evil, Harrison suggests, can be as different and resistant to generalization as Tolstoy's unhappy families.

In addition to its focus on the cognitive potential of literary fiction in general, the volume also takes up the topic of narrative. It is doubtful whether there can be a word at the moment more elastic than "narrative" across academic disciplines as different as historiography, sociology and religious studies -- usually a clear sign that philosophers might have some useful conceptual work to do. The philosophical importance of narrative for construals of self and agency, of course, reached in some ways a high point a generation or so ago, in the work of such figures as Paul Ricoeur, Charles Taylor and Alasdair MacIntyre -- all of whom saw narrative as essential for the task of self-knowledge. Yet there has been a reawakened attention to the topic of late among philosophers in the Anglophone tradition, both by philosophers interested in narrative's possible importance for connections to the neural and cognitive sciences (Daniel Dennett, David Velleman) and by those (Galen Strawson) who take a skeptical stance about the empirical and normative claims often made for narrative selfhood (and who favor instead a more "episodic" notion of the self). While the present volume does not discuss any of these particular strands of philosophical discussion of narrative (of the above figures only Dennett is mentioned in passing), it does offer some important contributions on this crucial topic. The second section of the volume begins with Arthur C. Danto's 1983 APA presidential address "Philosophy as/and/of Literature" and includes original contributions on the topic of narrative's ends or results from Richard Eldridge, who stresses narrative's importance for the "achievement of expressive freedom" ("The Ends of Narrative") and Garry L. Hagberg, who explores the notion of "true" vs. "good" autobiographical accounts ("Narrative Catharsis"). This section also includes essays on the wider interdisciplinary interest that narrative holds for history and political theory: Lubomír Doležel ("Postmodern Narratives of the Past: Simon Schama"), who examines the importance of narrative fictions within contemporary historiography, and Linda Hutcheon ("Traveling Stories: Knowledge, Activism and the Humanities"), who explores the importance of narrative in the context of political identity and action.

The third section of the volume concerns different literary modes of connecting with the real (including the essays on lyric and dramatic poetry by John and Altieri mentioned above) and addresses different claims concerning the form of knowledge or truth that can be said to be found in literature. Wolfgang Huemer's essay ("Why Read Literature? The Cognitive Function of Form") focuses on the importance of how literature says what it does, drawing on examples such as Peter Handke's famous poem listing the lineup of soccer players for FC Nürnberg. While Huemer acknowledges the importance of the argument that literature's purpose is not to add to the list of propositions we know, he also wants to insist that literature "does (also) add to our propositional knowledge" by allowing us to enlarge the "logical space" in which we can move -- something it does not by "communicating information about reality" but by putting us in a position that allows us to "gain propositional knowledge by drawing inferences we could or would not have drawn otherwise." Frank B. Farrell's essay ("'The Way Light at the Edge of a Beach in Autumn is Learned': Literature as Learning") has a similar interest in showing that literature does not so much present "asserted truth" as make us better at "tracking the truth-relevant features of the world."

The final section is framed by the volume's shortest contribution, a three-page excerpt from Kendall Walton's Mimesis as Make-Believe, a counter to Walton in the essay by Joseph Margolis ("Literature and Make-Believe"), and the essays of Alex Burri ("Art and the View from Nowhere") and Wolfgang Iser ("Culture: A Recursive Process"). The essays in this final section point to one area in which the volume's particular emphasis on cognitive issues may lead one to think that the opposition of fictionality and truth is often falsely conceived. Certainly Walton is right that a certain interest in truth as opposed to fiction is the product of culturally-inflected experience: the Greeks were more sophisticated tellers and appreciators of myths than to construe them in terms of this binary opposition so familiar to our (Enlightenment-oriented) cultural frame of reference. But Margolis seems likewise correct to question whether the inference to draw from this fact is that, in order to experience literary works as literary, we must view them as creating something like a world of "make-believe" which we must all pretend to be somehow true. Might there be an important way in which narrative fiction is (to use a phrase of David Velleman's about the "narrative self") fictive yet true?

There is more to be explored here (and no short review can do justice to such a wide variety of essays), but this volume makes an important contribution by focusing on several areas in which literary fiction and narrative remain of vital contemporary philosophical interest. A final concern to mention -- with an exhortation for the future: with a couple of exceptions, the volume's contributions involve few examples of close readings of literary texts. Careful work in visual aesthetics frequently requires consideration of particular painters, genres and schools, and it would have been especially useful if this volume devoted to the philosophy of literature had included more examples of philosophers engaged in (or at least drawing conclusions from) acts of first-order literary criticism. If, as at least some contributors to this volume seem to agree, there is no such thing as a "literary work of art as such or in general," then why should we continue to write about literature as if there were?