A Sentimentalist Theory of the Mind

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Michael Slote, A Sentimentalist Theory of the Mind, Oxford University Press, 2014, 247pp. $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199371754.

Reviewed by Lauren Ashwell, Bates College


Through his recent series of books, Michael Slote has built a comprehensive defense of the importance of emotion to our ethical, epistemic, and mental lives. In his newest book, Slote develops a picture of the mind as shot through with emotion. Beliefs themselves are emotional states, and emotion also plays a central role in unifying us as practical and epistemic agents. As this book brings together elements from ethics, epistemology, philosophy of action, and philosophy of mind, together with influence from some feminist work, readers with quite diverse interests will be able to find something of value to ponder.

Slote begins with the importance of empathy to epistemology -- as he also began From Enlightenment to Receptivity: Rethinking Our Values (Oxford University Press, 2013). The epistemic virtue of open-mindedness to other points of view requires, he maintains, a kind of emotionally receptive empathy. To believe something is, on Slote's view, to be in the emotional state of favoring a particular way of seeing the world, and to open-mindedly consider another's point of view is to feel some degree of this same positive emotion toward the other's view of the world. Slote doesn't say much about what this positive emotion is meant to be, but perhaps it is what we mean when we say that some claim about the world "feels right" to us.

When we believe something, we don't just favor seeing the world in a certain light, but we also have a positive emotion toward using the belief for practical purposes -- no matter how purely intellectual the belief might seem. This motivation toward practical reliance on a mental state is supposedly part of both belief and desire -- not just merely causally connected with these states -- and so does not require any additional prerequisite of rationality. Where someone fails to desire the means to their end, this shows that they simply don't want that end as much as they thought -- seeming cases of practical rationality, Slote claims, in fact turn out to be failures of self-knowledge.

Epistemic rationality does not, Slote argues in the book's appendix, require us to hold up all our beliefs to intense rational scrutiny. Just as we shouldn't hold those we care about at arm's length, scrutinizing their every move and always questioning our commitment to them, we also should not do this to our beliefs -- at least, not to the degree suggested by Cartesian skepticism. Knowledge based on perceptual experience requires a kind of receptivity to the world and a level of trust in our beliefs.

Slote aims to give a much broader treatment of the mind, however, than just a discussion of belief; he shifts gears in the middle of the book to address altruism and the importance of love to the human mind. He takes on recent arguments that purport to show that human motivation is at root egotistical; Slote argues that acting to avoid feelings of guilt or to avoid the disapproval of others -- seemingly egotistical motivations -- are in fact at least partly grounded in concern and respect for others. Such motivations aren't thereby completely altruistic, of course; instead, Slote wants us to recognize how important motivations that are neither purely altruistic nor egotistical -- like the desire to be loved or liked -- are to our lives.

Loving relationships, he argues, are necessary to early moral education, but also to early epistemic education. Loved children feels gratitude toward the adults who love them, and, Slote suggests, thereby starts to feel a diffuse kind of love and gratitude toward the world in general, which then motivates their moral behavior. Children learn to be empathetic when people who love them, and to whom they are grateful, teach them to see how their actions make others feel. Slote remarks that children might also learn epistemic empathy in a similar way. But he also admits that love is also sometimes to blame in making us epistemically irrational. Love is therefore both necessary for inculcating epistemic virtues, and, at least at times, to blame for our falling short of perfectly epistemic goodness.

I find Slote's view interesting and much of it plausible, and I think there is a lot of potential for extending this view to address other questions about the mind (for example: why is it sometimes so easy to slide from wanting something to be true to believing it to be true?). However, many of the key arguments in this book deeply puzzled me, and I found myself wanting a more detailed defense. I looked to some of Slote's other work for further insight, but found that many arguments were simply repeated from there nearly verbatim. Some chapters lacked a clear focus -- the chapter on the role of emotions in the unity of the mind (chapter 3), in particular, moved from one thing you might mean by "unification" to another, with Slote's easy-to-read writing style obscuring the transitions. After thinking about the book for some time, I have come to see some of his argumentative moves as more convincing than they seemed at first, but the book itself could have done more within its pages to dispel doubts.

One such argument involves the claim that beliefs have a partially desire-like direction of fit, and that this is explained by beliefs being emotional states. Now, the idea that belief and desire are distinguished by having different "directions of fit" is both prima facie intuitively plausible and notoriously difficult to explain. It seems to me, however, that direction of fit isn't really the concept that Slote is interested in. First, it is controversial what direction of fit emotion might have; Slote simply assumes that they are desire-like because they appear to be involved in motivating action. Second, Slote's understanding of what it would be for belief to have a desire-like direction of fit doesn't involve action directed toward bringing about anything even close to the content of the belief. It simply involves belief being involved in bringing about some action or other. So instead of this being a discussion about direction of fit, it is really just a discussion about being involved in motivating action.

Now, it is far less provocative to say that belief must be the type of state that is able to be involved in motivating action than to say it partly has a desire-like direction of fit. Yet behind this Slote has, I think, identified an important question: how is belief, as primarily a state that aims to represent the world, able to be involved in bringing about practical action? His arguments for his own solution, however, seem to me to be a little quick.

What we have on the Davidsonian picture are two states that come together to bring about an action. Slote's argument is that both states must be themselves action-directed in order for this to happen. In a trivial sense, it is true that they must both be directed toward action -- but this trivial sense does not support Slote's claim that belief must have a part that is itself directed toward action. Does sugar have a part that is directed toward rising because when we combine it with yeast, the bread rises quickly? In a trivial sense, sugar is disposed toward bringing about a rising-event (when sugar is combined with yeast in bread), but this is not due to sugar having a part directed toward rising. Instead, the sugar has nutritive properties that feed the yeast, and it is a by-product of the yeast's feeding on the sugar that causes the bread to rise. Similarly, for belief to have the ability to (together with appropriate desires) bring about action, it isn't necessary that beliefs themselves have a part that is itself directed toward action.

In general, two factors don't need to be "pointing" in the same "direction" to bring about motion in the direction of one of the factors. Think about the force provided by friction between your spinning tire and the road. Without the friction, although it is not a force in the direction of the resultant motion, the spinning wheel would not move the car. Of course, the relationship between belief and desire is not like that of a tire and friction; the point is simply that we need not impute the same "direction" to two factors in order for them to interact, resulting in something in the "direction" of one of the factors.

What we do need is a disposition toward using a belief in practical matters, and Slote's view is attractively economical as such a disposition is supposedly built right into the beliefs themselves. It's not entirely clear, however, why this would need to be an emotionally based disposition. He rests much of his claim that beliefs themselves are emotional on the idea that open-mindedness must involve a particularly emotional kind of empathy. Slote argues that truly open-minded persons do not just put themselves in others' shoes without actually feeling the way the others feel towards their way of seeing the world, because if this is what we did, we would be like psychopaths, "who [are] simply trying to probe or explore for weakness in other person's ideas and arguments" (p. 16). If open-mindedness involves emotional empathy, Slote argues, then belief must itself be emotional.

Yet here is a large gap between failing to feel the way another person does about what is true and being a manipulative epistemic psychopath (at least, I certainly hope there is). I suggest instead that in being open-minded, I must have a positive, respectful attitude toward my interlocutors as epistemic agents, and be open to the possibility that they are correct and I am not. This kind of caring and respect seems to be what the manipulative epistemic psychopath lacks, and it does seem to involve some kind of positive emotion toward the persons themselves. However, this kind of caring and respectful attitude toward persons doesn't require that I must actually emotionally empathize with their beliefs in being open-minded. In the classroom (particularly in my feminism class), I consider my students' views in a way I would hope should qualify as open-minded, but I often fail to feel the attraction that the students feel to their points of view -- even slightly. I must be caring and respectful toward the students as persons and so also as epistemic agents, but this does not require me to feel the attraction of the views they hold.

As a whole, however, the picture of the mind that Slote has drawn has many appealing features. It makes moral and non-moral thinking and acting more alike than we might have antecedently thought, and it is a picture of a more well-rounded human mind than that of the familiar disinterestedly objective rational believer. I recommend this book as one that will open you to an alternative and refreshing view of the nature of the human mind.