A Significant Life: Human Meaning in a Silent Universe

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Todd May, A Significant Life: Human Meaning in a Silent Universe, University of Chicago Press, 2015, 197pp., $25.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226235677.

Reviewed by Thaddeus Metz, University of Johannesburg


Todd May's book is a thoughtful, widely accessible, and comprehensive account of meaning in life. By meaning in life, I have in mind the question of what, if anything, can make an individual (human) person's existence significant and not, say, what the purpose of the human race as a whole is, which question these days professional philosophers often signify with talk of the meaning of life.

May more or less supposes from the outset that there is no meaning of life, i.e., that there is neither a God who created human life for a purpose nor some other property such that the universe makes sense or gives us a reason to live one way rather than another or even to live at all. Supposing that the universe is 'silent', as per the title of the book, which kinds of worthwhile lives might be available to a given one of us? That is the central question May seeks to answer.

In providing an answer to this question, May analyzes the sense of the question, addresses the relationships between happiness and meaningfulness as well as those between morality and meaningfulness, provides an intricate account of what can make a life meaningful, and, still more, offers an epistemic view of how we can make justified claims about meaning in a life. And he does all this without a lot of philosophical jargon, so that generally educated readers are sure to be able to take a lot away.

May's aim is not to demonstrate that his ideas have surpassed recent academic literature on what makes a life meaningful. Citations are sparse; there are 40 endnotes, and with fewer references than that in them. Many of May's claims, e.g., that the view that meaning consists of fulfilling God's purpose faces the Euthyphro problem, that happiness does not exhaust respects in which a life can be worth living, and that coherentism is a plausible way to grasp the nature of justified belief about meaning, will be familiar to those who know the Anglo-American literature on life's meaning. However, those unfamiliar with (or even uninterested in) that literature will learn much from May's discussions; they are put forth in clear and elegant ways in the context of concrete examples, often 'real life' ones of famous people.

In addition, May's theory of what (nearly) all meaningful conditions have in common is original in some ways and should be considered by those whose thinking is guided by professional English-language books and journals on the value of meaning. In the rest of this review, I focus largely on this more distinctive and revealing aspect of May's book, which takes up nearly half of the text (namely, the third and fourth chapters, out of five, as well as the conclusion).

Broadly speaking, May's view of what can make a life significant is naturalist, maintaining that meaning in a life is possible in a purely physical world, i.e., a spatio-temporal universe that is made up of sub-atomic particles and best known through empirical means. More than that, though, May also maintains that a life can be significant even if normativity is not 'built into the fabric' of the universe as per an Aristotelian, teleological construal of it.

One way of dividing up naturalist theoretical accounts of meaning in life is according to some familiar moral categories. In the Anglo-American literature on meaning in life, one readily encounters relativist, divine command, utilitarian, perfectionist, and deontological theories of what would make a human life significant, according to which a human person's life is meaningful insofar as it satisfies an individual's desires, fulfills God's purpose, promotes the general welfare, realizes higher natures, or relates in respectful ways (respectively).

Employing this sort of schema, May's view is usefully characterized as a virtue theory. According to him, roughly speaking, a life is more meaningful the more it exemplifies virtue. A virtue in general is a settled disposition to exhibit certain propositional attitudes. It is a property that, necessarily, spans a large portion of a person's adult life. One reason May focuses on virtue as the bearer of meaning is his apparent view that only people's lives as a whole (or at least very long stretches of them) are what can be meaningful or not.

From what I know of the field, the diachronic dimension of meaningfulness is under-developed relative to the synchronic. That is, when most English-speaking philosophers have thought about what confers meaning on a life, they have tended to focus on particular actions or projects at a given time and have not devoted the same kind of attention to patterns over the span of a life as a (near) whole. One appealing feature of May's view is the dedicated focus on the latter, chronological dimension of meaning.

However, one might plausibly find it too strong for May to suggest that meaning is merely diachronic, lacking a synchronic dimension entirely. A once-off decision to rescue a child from a burning building could intuitively confer some meaning on a person's life even if it were 'out of character', not something she would ordinarily do. In addition, the occasional composition of poetry that turns out to be pretty good seems able to make one's life more meaningful even if one is not rightly labeled a 'poet' given how sporadic one's labor is.

The best reply from May to these kinds of cases, I think, is to suggest that the most substantial kinds of meaning can come from a long-term orientation and not merely because it would facilitate a large aggregate of actions that are meaningful in themselves. There is something about being a firefighter or poet that is plausibly much more meaning-conferring than the sorts of cases above.

Others have advanced a virtue-based approach to meaning in life before, including E. J. Bond (in his 1983 Reason and Value) and the later Richard Taylor (e.g., in his 1985 Ethics, Faith, and Reason). What makes May's particular version of it distinct and interesting is the way that he construes the relevant virtues.

According to May, what a firefighter or poet would have, insofar as their lives are meaningful, would be particular kinds of virtues that he calls 'narrative values'. May is careful to distinguish his sense of 'narrativity' from more common ones. So, he denies that a meaningful life is one that must take the form of a story, for example. Instead, a narrative value is a desirable theme characterizing a life trajectory that can be constituted by the moral or the aesthetic but need not be. Key examples of narrative values for May are steadfastness, intensity, integrity, adventurousness, courage, and creativity.

This account of what (substantially) confers meaning on a human person's life is a novel and attractive addition to the field. The glaring problem with it, as I have construed it so far, is that it is utterly non-moral and so entails that resolute and clever mass murder would be meaning-conferring. This concern prompts May to engage in an intricate discussion of how the moral and the meaningful interrelate. Ultimately, he concludes that while a narrative value need not be a moral one, it must not be employed for a seriously immoral project in order for meaning to accrue.

In fact, May contends that when a narrative value is pressed into the service of evil, it not only fails to confer meaning but also subtracts from the meaningfulness of a person's life. That is, May believes in what I in my work have called 'anti-matter', conditions of life that make it matter less, that are a substantive disvalue beyond the mere absence of value.

May's qualification, that narrative value must not be directed toward evil for it to enhance meaning in a life, is apt in my view, though I acknowledge that some contemporary philosophers, such as Harry Frankfurt and John Kekes, do believe that mass murder could be meaning-conferring. The point I want to make is that if one agrees that evil or extremely degrading behavior undercuts the meaningfulness of a narrative value, then one should probably go further in admitting additional restrictions beyond those May considers. Think, for example, about the steadfast counter of blades of grass or detector of non-causal correlations. Or think about someone with impeccable integrity who strives to make his surroundings as ugly and more generally aesthetically bad as he can. Even if these projects are not full-blown anti-matter, i.e., do not subtract from the meaning in a person's life, they surely add little, if any, to it.

May would likely reply by pointing out that a meaningful life often has more than one narrative value and that these virtues are one-sided. However, he appears to have to grant that some real meaning could come from these orientations even if more would come from additional narrative values. My intuition, though, is that even if there is some meaning in the cases, it is not notable. Looking back on one's life from one's deathbed, it would not be apt to feel great esteem for having engaged in them, and it would not be sensible for others to express much admiration in a eulogy for one having done so.

These kinds of cases suggest to me that insofar as narrative values or virtues are (substantially) meaning-conferring, they need to be employed toward particular kinds of objects. In my own theoretical reflections on meaning in life, I have argued that (substantial) meaning comes from positively orienting the robust exercise of one's rational nature toward fundamentality, roughly, conditions responsible for many other conditions of key dimensions of human existence. Regardless of whether that view best captures the truly meaningful ways to exercise virtues, it seems to me worth considering whether there is some kind of pattern to them beyond a requirement to avoid severe kinds of immorality.

Another salient feature of May's view about what can make a life meaningful is his claim that 'subjective attraction', in the influential words of Susan Wolf, is necessary for it. With Wolf, May maintains that one must be engaged in or love what one is doing at the time in order for it to be meaningful. Of course, being subjectively attracted to one's project is not sufficient for meaning, however; one must, for May, also be exemplifying a narrative value, the relevant sort of objectively attractive project.

This sort of position is common to hold in the field, and one readily sees why. A meaningful life is intuitively understood not to be one of boredom or dissatisfaction. Instead, quintessentially meaningful activities, e.g., playing music, making love, composing an essay, are ones in which a person has lost track of time and is captured by the moment.

Elsewhere I have argued that even if such absorption would greatly enhance meaning in life, by virtue of more facets of one's (rational) self being involved, it is not necessary for it. For one example, I invite the reader to consider a case in which one volunteers to be bored so that others will not be bored. Voluntarily making a sacrifice in which one foregoes subjective attraction so that others can have it is arguably a source of meaning and perhaps to a great degree if others are helped significantly. If so, then subjective attraction in the course of displaying narrative value is not necessary for meaning. May does not consider such a case, though I am sure that he would have thoughtful things to say about it if he were to address it.

In all, as someone well acquainted with work on life's meaning composed by professional philosophers, I have profited from reading May's book, especially his discussion of what can confer (substantial) meaning on a person's life. I especially recommend his work in virtue of it being a 'good read', avoiding technicalities and reflecting on everyday examples with insight. It would be ideal to assign for an upper-level undergraduate course or to share as a gift with reflective friends and family outside the academy.