A Social Theory of Freedom

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Mariam Thalos, A Social Theory of Freedom, Routledge, 2016, 278pp., $119.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138931589.

Reviewed by Per-Erik Milam, University of Gothenburg


Philosophical discussions of freedom might plausibly be seen as revolving around two main centres of gravity: a 'metaphysical' conception of freedom as free action (or freedom of the will) and a 'political' conception of freedom as liberty. Mariam Thalos' new book is motivated by the belief that neither of these conceptions adequately captures the sort of freedom we care about. The problem, as she sees it, is that both mistakenly view freedom as the absence of constraint. As she characterises these views, metaphysical freedom is made possible by the absence of determinism and political freedom by the absence of domination. By contrast, Thalos argues that freedom is not properly understood as the absence of constraint, but rather as the "freedom to embrace and construct identities for oneself in the social world" (1). This social theory of freedom, developed in part 1 (chapters 1-4), is meant to replace these inadequate conceptions as the "only . . . conception of freedom worthy of the name" (15).

Chapter 1 argues that the conceptual apparatus used by the metaphysician and political theorist are inadequate. Thalos rejects the 'interventionist theory of action,' according to which "action is intervention in an ongoing stream of events connected by relations of cause and effect" (26). Likewise, it is a mistake to think that the forces by which agents and groups oppress and dominate others completely eliminate the freedom of the oppressed and dominated (56-57). Thalos prefers to understand action as 'world-making' (45). Rather than focusing on our causal influence in the world or our state of subjugation, she suggests that, "freedom comes in proportion to the ability to employ concepts in the course of rational judgment" (47).

Chapter 2 develops the idea that the sort of freedom worth wanting is freedom as 'world-making' (82). The central metaphor here is sourcehood -- one must be the "architect" or "ultimate definer" of oneself (63). (This is a familiar position in the 'metaphysical' free will debate, though Thalos doesn't acknowledge it.) One is the source of oneself, in the sense required for freedom, when one engages in "a form of world-making in which the materials are sufficiently malleable as to allow a variety of outcomes" (75). This malleability is then cashed out in terms of our capacity for judgement. One is free to the extent that one is able to aspire to shape oneself and the ability to aspire is an ability to make judgments and to reject the judgments of others (74). (Understanding sourcehood in terms of having options is also a familiar move, but again Thalos does not acknowledge it as such.)[1]

Chapter 3 presents the core of the social theory of freedom. Thalos contends that constraint does not preclude freedom, but rather makes freedom possible. A person acts freely only insofar as she acts against the constraints placed on her by her material and social circumstances. Just as walking requires working intelligently against the restraints of gravity and friction, so freedom requires working intelligently against the constraints provided by others' expectations (96-97). This insight leads Thalos to the claim that freedom is best understood as a logic -- i.e., a form of reasoning with a standard of correctness. Without the constraint provided by such a standard, reasoning would not be possible. Likewise, there are standards for aspiration, which Thalos calls 'truths of authenticity' (102). Along with the prerequisite that one perceive oneself as having options, world-making of the sort that constitutes freedom requires that one's aspirations are authentic. And aspirations are authentic when they 'fit' these standards. So what are the relevant standards? Thalos is somewhat vague here. She suggests that an authentic aspiration is one that fits with one's history and that diverges from the expectations society has for one (103). She states her position as follows: "freedom is the (logical) relationship--what I will refer to as the distance--between one's aspirations and the slate of social/societal expectations relevant to oneself" (105). With this framework in place, Thalos is, she thinks, in a position to explain some of our common intuitions about freedom. For example, one is free even in circumstances where one lacks alternative possibilities just in case one has epistemic freedom and one's aspirations are authentic (106).

Chapter 4 develops an accompanying account of practical reasoning. In deciding how to act, an agent should be understood as "performing her values" (121). Practical reasoning is a form of aspirational reasoning whereby we imitate the sort of person who would do X, Y, or Z. For example, when deciding what to eat, I might reason as follows: a conscientious person would choose the vegan option; I aspire to be a conscientious person; so I will choose the vegan option (123).

In part 2, Thalos develops her objections to metaphysical and political conceptions of freedom. Chapter 5 argues that "The metaphysical conception of freedom is not worthy of the name" (151). However, while the chapter is meant to take aim at the metaphysical conception of freedom, the brunt of Thalos' criticism falls on two rather surprising targets: those who think that agency implies freedom and those who think that indeterminism enhances the control necessary for freedom. The first target is surprising because few defend this position. Indeed, her conclusion that "what is wanted is an account of how the will . . . itself is free" (149) is precisely the starting point for the metaphysical free will debate at least since Harry Frankfurt's paper, "Freedom of the Will and the Concept of a Person" (1971). Her second target is surprising because earlier she claims that determinism is irrelevant to human freedom (15). Moreover, libertarians and compatibilists have debated whether indeterminism can enhance control for at least two decades (e.g., Robert Kane 1996), but Thalos does not acknowledge this literature.

Chapter 6 argues that the essence of freedom is social and political (151), but that the traditional political conception of freedom as non-domination is not what we're after. Thalos suggests that there is a freedom possessed even by those who are subjugated, so long as they can authentically aspire to a different state (127, 247). Consider Fredrick Douglass reflecting on his resolution not to let his brutal master dominate his mind. Thalos thus rejects the political conception of freedom as non-domination. There is room for freedom so long as there is room to authentically aspire (156).

In part 3, Thalos explains how social factors can facilitate and impede being and becoming free. Chapter 7 explains how we acquire our social identities. We can invent some of our identities "literally at will" (167-168). This process of self-construction occurs in the same way as aspiration. We form social identities though a process of 'identificational bonding,' which requires an exercise of judgment, namely, a conceptualisation of oneself as affiliated with another 'side' (178-179). When one aspires, one identifies with a future self different from one's present self -- e.g., when I aspire to attend college, I identify with my future college-educated self. Similarly, when one affiliates oneself with a group, one aligns oneself with them -- e.g., when I affiliate myself with a political party. In both cases, the process is one of self-ascription. Of course, some groups are not accessible via self-ascription (183), but the ease of self-ascription to open identities (e.g., Democrat) and affiliative solidarity with closed identities (e.g., Jewish) explains how various modes of "affiliative resistance" work (e.g., 'taking back' racial slurs or tweeting "I am Michael Brown").

Chapter 8 argues that love relationships are a "sheltering space for self-making" (196). The ability to authentically aspire and create ourselves requires that we perceive our future as open. For example, I can only aspire to be a good skier if I recognise that I can improve by practicing. Other aspirations, like being a good neighbour, require personal relationships. And some of our most valuable aspirations require love relationships. One can only make oneself a good parent, a true friend, or a caring lover if one is in the relevant sort of relationship (200). Moreover, while society often encourages 'de-personalisation' through conformity, love relationships promote 're-personalisation' by nurturing our sense of who we can be (199). (Chapter 9 provides an account of solidarity and collective agency, but this discussion is more removed from Thalos' account of freedom, so I will not discuss it in here.)

This is an ambitious book. Thalos' central insight is that there is a form of freedom that is independent of both domination and determinism -- a freedom possessed by both the slave and the Laplacian agent. This freedom is social in the sense that it is structured (facilitated and impeded) by how we see ourselves and our possibilities and by how we see and are seen by others. I'm convinced that there is something right about this, but I also have some concerns about the details of the project. Thalos aims to replace 'metaphysical' and 'political' conceptions of freedom with an account that captures what is essentially social about freedom. Doing this requires that she (a) explain how these two conceptions are inadequate, (b) explain paradigmatic cases of freedom and unfreedom (for both conceptions), and (c) show how her social theory offers a novel account of freedom rather than a restatement of existing views in different terms. In the rest of this review I'll give some reasons for thinking that Thalos does not succeed in these tasks.

While Thalos offers an account of freedom grounded in existentialism, it's not entirely clear what substantive corrections she makes to the views she finds so inadequate. Thalos claims that a person is free when she chooses from amongst her perceived options and acts so as to make herself who she authentically wants to be. The fundamental components of this theory are epistemic openness, sourcehood, and authenticity. But these concepts have been at the centre of the 'metaphysical' free will debate for many years. There are well-established positions on the relevance of epistemic openness, the way in which one must create or author oneself, and what makes a choice or action authentic. Her account of authentic aspiration is also offered in terms that would be familiar to the 'metaphysicians' she derides. The ability to aspire is an ability to judge one course of action worthy and to reject others' judgments of what is worthy (74). And her particular account of when aspirations are authentic, namely, when they fit with one's history and aren't unduly influenced by others' judgments and desires also falls well within the boundaries of existing debates.[2] Of course, finding a new route to a familiar view of freedom would still be impressive if the particular account is successful.

Unfortunately, I'm not sure Thalos' account captures the sort of freedom we care about. First of all, it doesn't seem to explain responsibility, which is the primary aim of most 'metaphysical' theories. (The subject of responsibility comes up only in passing.) Her account does not seem able to explain when a person is blameworthy or praiseworthy for her choices. The claim that "you are free in proportion to how far that aspirational self befits your experience of yourself in the past and diverges from the self that is held up to you for imitation by Others" (136, her emphasis) does not capture common experiences, like turning over a new leaf or coming to conform to appropriate societal demands. Sometimes we make an effort to depart from our history and to accept the expectations of society -- e.g., consider the avowed racist who is slowly persuaded by insistent anti-racist friends and acquaintances to abandon his racist attitudes, beliefs, and actions.

Thalos' theory also fails to explain what's problematic about oppression, which has been a central aim of 'political' theories of freedom. (Oppression and domination also receive only passing mention in the text.) Thalos acknowledges that societies can be structured such that individuals are unable to form authentic aspirations, but she does not explore these challenges. For example, does adaptive preference formation undermine authentic aspiration? Thalos says that authentic aspirations diverge from the expectations held up by society, but does not distinguish between the very different ways in which a society may impose its expectations. A society might encourage women not to aspire to fulfilling employment outside the home, but also encourage citizens to value scientific accomplishments and desire to promote social justice. The first phenomenon seems to undermine authentic aspiration, but the second does not. These are questions taken up by both metaphysical and political theories of freedom, but Thalos does not address them. Political theorists in particular discuss the social and material conditions that must exist in order for a person to (come to) be able to authentically aspire and act on her aspirations -- John Stuart Mill, Sandra Bartky, Phillip Pettit, and Ann Cudd are a few examples who appear in Thalos' bibliography but whose theories are left unexplored in the text. This lack of engagement with issues of responsibility and oppression is especially surprising given that these topics represent the distinctively social focus of contemporary 'metaphysical' and 'political' theories of freedom. This may not been quite so significant had Thalos intended her theory as a supplement to the metaphysical and political conceptions of freedom, but she intends it as a wholesale replacement.

Finally, as I have already noted, while existing conceptions of freedom may be inadequate, Thalos does not correctly diagnose their inadequacies. 'Metaphysical' theories are not obsessed with the threat of determinism and 'political' theories do not think that social constraints completely eliminate human freedom. Indeed, both conceptions are concerned with precisely the questions Thalos raises and many more that she overlooks.

Finally, there are many cases of poor editing, including parenthetical citations missing from the bibliography (19, 150, 177, 192), incorrect publication dates (19, 264), quotations without cited page numbers (177, 191, 202), and typographical errors. However, these are mistakes on the part of the editors at Routledge.

[1] Classic sourcehood accounts include Galen Strawson's "The Impossibility of Moral Responsibility" (1994) and Derk Pereboom's Living without Free Will (2001). Robert Kane's The Significance of Free Will (1996) is an example of cashing out sourcehood in terms of having options.

[2] On epistemic openness, see Peter van Inwagen's Essay on Free Will (1983), David Velleman's "Epistemic Freedom" (1989), and Dana Nelkin's "Deliberative Alternatives" (2004). On sourcehood, see Galen Strawson (1994), Robert Kane (1996), and John Martin Fischer's "Responsibility and Self-Expression" (1999). On authenticity, see Harry Frankfurt (1971), Gary Watson's "Free Agency" (1975), and David Shoemaker's "Caring, Identification, and Agency" (2003). On the importance of our capacity for judgment, see Susan Wolf's Freedom Within Reason (1990) and John Martin Fischer and Mark Ravizza's Responsibility and Control (1998) and Angela Smith's "Responsibility for Attitudes" (2005) on responsibility for expressing evaluative judgments. See Fischer and Ravizza (1998) and Al Mele's Autonomous Agents (1995) on the importance of history and John Stuart Mill's On Liberty, Sandra Bartky's Femininity and Domination (1990), and Ann Cudd's Analyzing Oppression (2006) on how external influences on judgment can be problematic.