A Theory of Justice for Animals: Animal Rights in a Nonideal World

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Robert Garner, A Theory of Justice for Animals: Animal Rights in a Nonideal World, Oxford University Press, 2013, 197pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199936335.

Reviewed by Brian Berkey, Stanford University


In this book, Robert Garner takes up several important and interrelated questions about the moral status of, and our obligations to, nonhuman animals. He defends three central and closely linked views. First, he seeks to establish that animals are owed justice, as opposed to (merely) moral concern -- that is, he argues that principles of justice apply to our treatment of animals. Second, he defends a particular account of what animals are entitled to as a matter of justice, which he calls the "enhanced sentience position" (pp. 15, 133). On this view, animals have a right not to suffer at the hands of humans, and a strong enough interest in continued life that only very weighty human interests can justify sacrificing their lives (pp. 15-16, 133). Lastly, he argues that, assuming that the enhanced sentience position represents the correct ideal theory of justice for animals, reflection on prevailing social, political, and economic conditions suggests that we ought to adopt the mitigation of animal suffering as our primary near-term goal with respect to the human treatment of animals. In his terms, we should accept the "sentience position," which "prohibit[s] . . . the infliction of suffering on animals for human benefits," but does not regard the painless killing of animals as morally problematic, as our preferred non-ideal theory of justice for animals (pp. 18, 135).

The book makes important contributions to ongoing debates about our obligations to animals, and about the grounds of those obligations. In particular, it highlights some of the reasons why it is important for theorists of justice to take seriously the inclusion of animals within the scope of their principles, and helpfully casts the question of how those concerned about promoting animals' fundamental interests ought to proceed, given prevailing barriers to achieving fully acceptable treatment in the near-term, as one of non-ideal theory analogous to that faced by those concerned about promoting justice for humans in recalcitrantly unjust societies.

Despite these significant virtues, there are aspects of Garner's arguments that are puzzling and problematic. I will focus on the arguments that he offers for each of the central claims noted above, highlighting what seem to me to be their most important contributions as well as their most significant problems.

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The first central claim that Garner defends is that animals are owed justice rather than simply moral concern. The argument for this claim consists in part in criticisms of prominent views that exclude animals as objects of direct concern under principles of justice. For example, John Rawls excludes animals from his theory of justice on the ground that they are not moral persons, and because they do not contribute to society, which is conceived for the purposes of the theory as "a cooperative venture for mutual advantage" (p. 24, quoting Rawls 1971, p. 4). Garner notes that Rawls does claim that we have moral obligations to animals, including an obligation not to treat them cruelly (pp. 24-5), but suggests that his view cannot permit more than minimal state protection of animal interests, and should therefore be rejected.

Rawls's view is inconsistent with robust state protection of fundamental animal interests, according to Garner, because of the conjunction of its exclusion of animals and its commitment to political liberalism, or what Garner calls "moral pluralism" (pp. 26, 50). The liberal principle of moral pluralism holds, roughly, that the state must protect individuals' liberty to pursue their reasonable conceptions of the good, where a conception of the good is considered unreasonable only if its pursuit would be inconsistent with a commitment to the principles of justice. Since, on Rawls's view, animals are not owed anything as a matter of justice, it appears that he is committed to rejecting state interference with the pursuit of conceptions of the good that involve, for example, inflicting even severe suffering on animals for religious reasons, or in the course of engaging in valued activities such as hunting (pp. 26-7). Only appeals to comprehensive moral views, which are ruled out by political liberalism, could provide reasons for prohibiting the infliction of such suffering.

It seems to me that this argument represents a serious challenge to any view that attempts to combine the exclusion of animals from the scope of principles of justice with political liberalism, and Garner's development of the argument, though a bit brief here,[1] is one of the book's more significant contributions. The view that the state is permitted, and perhaps even required, to prevent serious harm from being inflicted on animals, even when the infliction of such harm would occur in pursuit of conceptions of the good that political liberals are committed to regarding, for the purposes of their theories, as "reasonable" (e.g., conceptions informed by interpretations of passages from the Book of Genesis according to which animals were created by God for the use of humans), is widely accepted, even by those who deny that animals are entitled to justice. It should, at the very least, be considered a substantial cost of a view that its acceptance precludes permitting such state action.

Of course, one way of avoiding the view that state protection of fundamental animal interests is impermissible is to allow that state policy can, and indeed in some cases should, be informed by comprehensive moral views, including views about morally acceptable treatment of animals. If we take this view, then we can accept that animal interests give rise to strong moral reasons that govern both our individual treatment of animals and appropriate state policy, without accepting that it is principles of justice, in particular, that explain the need for policies protecting animals.

Garner argues, however, that we should reject views according to which animals are owed strong forms of moral concern, but not justice. Much of the argument for this claim, however, appears not to support the claim itself, but rather the view that our believing the claim is likely to lead us to act in ways that are morally better than we otherwise would. He says, for example, that justice is a concept that has "an extremely high status," and that not being regarded as owed justice is "a serious obstacle to being regarded as a morally considerable entity deserving of respectful treatment" (p. 1). He adds that "moral obligations regarded as being outside of the sphere of justice collapse, in practice, into the realm of charity and voluntarism precisely because there is a much weaker link with legal compulsion" (p. 8, emphasis in original).

There are a few distinct thoughts here, but it is not clear that any of them support the claim that animals are in fact owed justice. First, Garner seems to suggest that if we don't believe that animals are owed justice, then we will be unlikely to view them as owed serious moral concern, and so unlikely to treat them in the ways that such concern requires. If this were true, then it would show that if we are convinced that animals are owed serious moral concern, we have practical reasons to try to make ourselves believe that they are owed justice, and perhaps to consciously use the language of justice when discussing our obligations to them with others. But it would not show that animals are in fact owed justice, as opposed to serious moral concern. Rather, it would suggest that getting ourselves to believe (correctly or incorrectly) that they are owed justice is a necessary means of ensuring that we will act in accordance with the required degree of moral concern. In addition, the claim that lacking the belief that a set of beings is owed justice is likely to lead to a lack of sufficient regard for their morally important interests strikes me as dubious. After all, many theorists believe that we do not owe justice to those outside of our national borders, but also believe that we owe strong forms of moral concern to all human beings, regardless of their location or citizenship status. And I know of no evidence that those who hold this view are less likely to act in ways that are consistent with it than are those who accept that principles of justice have global scope (though it may be that those who hold the latter view are more likely to do things to, for example, aid the global poor that are considered supererogatory on typical versions of the former view).

Garner also appears to think that we should accept that animals are owed justice because if we do not, then, first, state protection of fundamental animal interests will be more difficult to justify, and relatedly, we will tend not to treat serious concern for animals' interests as obligatory, but rather as a supererogatory form of "charity" to animals. The latter concern, like those discussed in the previous paragraph, does not provide support for the view that animals are in fact owed justice. The claim that if we deny that animals are owed justice, then state protection of their fundamental interests will be more difficult to justify, is also somewhat puzzling, given that it is made as part of an argument that animals are in fact owed justice. Garner seems to be relying on the thought that claims of justice are enforceable by means of state coercion, while independent moral claims are not (pp. 2, 8).[2] But he also seems simply to assume (and with good reason) that state coercion aimed at protecting at least some basic animal interests, for the sake of the animals, is justified. The conjunction of these two claims, however, straightforwardly entails that animals are owed justice.

Opponents of the claim that animals are owed justice will, I take it, tend not to deny that state prohibitions on, for example, cruel treatment of animals are justified, but rather to deny that only claims of justice are coercively enforceable. Garner's argument, however, fails to engage this type of view. The fact that his argument relies on the premise that only claims of justice are coercively enforceable, then, renders the conclusion of the argument much less significant than it may appear to be.

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A suitably modified version of Garner's argument for the enhanced sentience position, however, if initially taken as an argument about what we owe animals generally (rather than specifically as a matter of justice), may be able to serve as the basis for an improved defense of the view that animals are owed justice. He begins by endorsing a rights-based view of animals' entitlements, along with the interest-based conception of rights developed most notably by Joseph Raz (1986). His reason for accepting a rights-based view, as opposed to a view on which we have moral duties to animals despite the fact that they lack rights, is that "the exclusion of animals as rights holders is likely to diminish the importance attached to [our] moral duties [to them] . . . because of the high status accorded to rights in modern society" (p. 95). This line of reasoning is, of course, problematic for reasons that are by now familiar. His reason for adopting the interest-based view of rights is, essentially, that it can allow that animals have rights, while its main competitor, the choice or will based view, cannot. Given the aims of the argument, however, the adoption of this view seems to require some independent motivation, which Garner does not provide.

Nevertheless, there are, it seems to me, independent reasons to favor the interest-based view of rights, and so independent reasons to think that animals have rights. The next step in Garner's argument is an appeal to what he calls the "equal consideration of interests principle" (p. 97). This principle says, in David DeGrazia's words, that "whenever a human and an animal have a comparable interest, we should regard the animals interest and the human's interest as equally morally important" (p. 98, quoting DeGrazia 2002, p. 19). If we accept this principle (which it seems clear to me that we should) along with the interest-based view of rights, then it follows that insofar as animals share with humans the interests that we take to ground rights possessed by humans, we must accept that animals have equivalent rights. And since animals do in fact have similar interests to humans in, for example, avoiding suffering, acceptance of the interest-based view of rights and the equal consideration of interests principle commits us to accepting that animals have the right not to suffer at our hands. In addition, since animals have a significant interest in continued life, though not an interest that is as strong as that of humans, only very significant human interests could justify us in depriving animals of their lives.

This line of argument seems to me extremely plausible, but given the problems with the argument that Garner provides for the view that animals are owed justice, even if it works it shows only that animals have moral rights, and not that they are owed justice. The argument can be extended to support the claim that animals are owed justice, however, if it can be argued that the interests that ground the rights that humans and animals share constitute at least part of the ground of humans' entitlement to justice. If, for example, it can be established that the human interest in avoiding suffering, or in having the necessary means to live a decent life, are at least part of the explanation of why humans are owed justice, then we can appeal to the equal consideration of interests principle to argue that those same interests must ground an entitlement to justice for animals.

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This seems to me to be a promising way of extending Garner's argument, but it is bound to encounter substantial resistance from those who are committed to views about the grounds of entitlement to justice that exclude individual interests. Since Rawls is among this group, as his contractualist view holds that considerations of reciprocity and fairness, rather than individual interests, ground entitlements to justice, its development would require Garner to distance himself from aspects of Rawls's thinking that he endorses in the book, including Rawls's view about the relationship between justice and permissible state coercion, and at least certain aspects of his view about the relationship between ideal and non-ideal theory.

Garner argues that those concerned about promoting justice for animals in our current, radically unjust circumstances should adopt the sentience position as their non-ideal theory, and should therefore focus their efforts on limiting animal suffering, since "there is a strong argument that the sentience position seeks to remove the most grievous, or most urgent, injustice inflicted on animals" (p. 135). The claim that the near-term focus on those concerned about protecting animals' most important interests should be on reducing suffering strikes me as quite plausible. But there is a crucial ambiguity in Garner's discussion of the implications of the sentience position as a non-ideal theory, as he understands it. In addition, one way that the ambiguity can be resolved appears to be consistent with the view that central interests shared by humans and animals play a role in grounding entitlements to justice, but inconsistent with central Rawlsian commitments that Garner seems to endorse; and the other seems to be consistent with the Rawlsian commitments but inconsistent with the role of interests in grounding entitlements to justice.

Like Rawls, Garner links justice closely with permissible state coercion, and at least seems primarily concerned with the pursuit of changes in state policy, including in his discussion of non-ideal theory. One way of understanding the sentience position, then, is as directing us exclusively to seek changes in state policy that would better protect animals' interest in avoiding suffering. This view is analogous to Rawls's view about our obligations of justice in non-ideal circumstances, which directs us to contribute to efforts to make our basic institutions more just, but not to directly promote the interests of the victims of prevailing injustice (Rawls 1971, p. 115). It does not, however, fit well with the view that it is the interests of humans and animals that directly ground entitlements to justice, since it directs us to seek institutional changes even when efforts to promote directly the relevant interests are certain to do more to advance those interests (Murphy 1998, pp. 278-84). On the other hand, we might, more plausibly in my view, understand the sentience position as requiring that we direct our efforts in whatever way would most significantly reduce animal suffering in the long run, whether it be by seeking institutional changes or through more direct means, such as providing resources to organizations that will use them to remove animals from circumstances in which they are likely to suffer seriously. This view fits much more naturally with the interest-based view of rights and the grounds of entitlements to justice, but is inconsistent with Rawls's account of the relationship between ideal and non-ideal theory, and at least in tension with the close identification of requirements of justice with permissible state coercion, since it entails that individuals can promote justice, and can be obligated to do so, through non-institutional means, and in ways that it may not always be permissible to use the apparatus of the state to force them to.

Garner provides us, then, with some of the key pieces of what seems to me a potentially strong argument for the view that animals are owed justice, and for the view that we are obligated as a matter of justice in our current non-ideal circumstances to contribute to efforts to reduce the most serious forms of animal suffering. Despite the problems that I've noted, then, the book has much to recommend it to those who are interested in thinking about our obligations to animals in circumstances like ours, in which our treatment of them is, on any plausible view, far from morally acceptable.


DeGrazia, David. 2002. Animal Rights: A Very Short Introduction. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Flew, Anthony. 1985. Thinking about Social Thinking: The Philosophy of the Social Sciences.Oxford: Blackwell.

Garner, Robert. 2005. The Political Theory of Animal Rights. Manchester: Manchester University Press.

Murphy, Liam B. 1998. "Institutions and the Demands of Justice." Philosophy and Public Affairs 27: 251-91.

Rawls, John. 1971. A Theory of Justice. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

Raz, Joseph. 1986. The Morality of Freedom. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

[1] He discusses it in more detail in Chapter 3 of his 2005.

[2] See also the reference (p. 48) to Flew 1985. Note, however, that Flew says only that some moral claims that are independent of justice may not be enforced by the state.