A Theory of Political Obligation: Membership, Commitment, and the Bonds of Society

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Margaret Gilbert, A Theory of Political Obligation: Membership, Commitment, and the Bonds of Society, Oxford University Press, 2006, 332pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199274959.

Reviewed by David Lefkowitz, University of North Carolina, Greensboro


Does membership in a political society, in and of itself, involve obligations to uphold that society’s political institutions?  Margaret Gilbert offers a novel argument in defense of an affirmative answer to this question, which she labels the membership problem.  Given a plausible construal of the concepts obligation, political society, and membership in a political society, Gilbert argues that it follows analytically that to be a member of a political society just is to have an obligation to uphold and support that society’s political institutions.  The key to Gilbert’s argument is the idea of a joint commitment; those who jointly commit to X as a body thereby acquire obligations vis-à-vis the others with whom they jointly act.  Social groups, including political societies, exist as the result of such a commitment amongst those who constitute them.  In virtue of their joint commitment, agents form a plural subject, and so Gilbert titles her solution to the membership problem the plural subject theory of political obligation. 

As a renewed and improved defense of two historical accounts rarely given much credence today, namely an argument by appeal to conceptual analysis and an argument by appeal to actual consent, Gilbert’s book deserves the attention of all those concerned with the topic of political obligation.  Moreover, given her intriguing analysis of a wide range of social phenomena, including promises and agreements, Gilbert’s book merits the attention of a wider audience as well.

Consider, first, the concept of a genuine obligation.  To have a genuine obligation to do a certain thing is, first, to have sufficient reason to do that thing.  According to Gilbert, “X has sufficient reason for performing A if and only if a consideration C that speaks in favor of X’s doing A is such that, all else being equal, rationality requires that X do A, given C” (29).  If there is a consideration that speaks against X’s doing A, such that it would not be irrational for her to fail to do A, then all else is not equal.  Second, Gilbert endorses the common characterization of genuine obligations as relatively conclusive, by which she means that they defeat or trump inclination and self-interest as reasons for action.  That is, if one has a genuine obligation to do A, then holding all else equal, one rationally ought to do A even if inclination and/or self-interest speak against doing it.  Genuine obligations are not necessarily absolutely conclusive reasons for action, however; a second obligation (perhaps of a different sort) may provide a rational justification for not doing what one has a genuine obligation to do. 

Gilbert contrasts genuine obligations with what she labels imputed obligations, which might be best understood as obligations alleged to provide sufficient reason for action, but which may not do so.  Legal obligations are an example of imputed obligations; they may provide sufficient reason for action, but they can exist without doing so.  More important, however, is Gilbert’s claim that to be bound by a genuine obligation is not necessarily to be bound by a moral requirement.  Philosophical discussion of political obligation typically assumes that what is at issue is a particular kind of moral reason for subjects to support the state that rules them.  In contrast, Gilbert aims to demonstrate that members of a political society have genuine obligations to support its governing institutions, even if they do not have any moral reason to do so (or indeed, even if morality gives them reason not to support their governing institutions, all things considered). 

Next consider the concept of a social group, of which political societies are one type.  A set of individuals constitute a social group (and so something more than a mere set of individuals) if they are jointly committed to do X as a body.  More precisely, a population makes up a social group if “(1) they are jointly committed to espousing as a body the appropriate goal; (2) they are fulfilling the behavioral conditions associated with the achievement of that goal; [and] (3) their satisfaction of these conditions is motivated in each case by the existence of the joint commitment” (146).  Like personal decisions, joint commitments are acts of will, except that while the former are made by individuals singly, and provide reason to act only for that agent, joint commitments are made collectively by two or more people, and bind collectively all those who together make the commitment.

By jointly committing to espouse as a body some goal, the parties to the joint commitment acquire genuine obligations to one another.  That is, the joint commitment provides a relatively conclusive sufficient reason for action to those agents who have made it; at the very least, they rationally ought not to act from inclination or self-interest in cases where doing so conflicts with upholding the joint commitment.  Gilbert emphasizes that “a joint commitment obligates by virtue of its structure, that is, by virtue of its jointness,” and not the circumstances of its creation, the content of the obligations it creates, or some feature of the goal to which the parties are jointly committed (163).  Thus Gilbert’s analysis of obligations of joint commitment clear the way for what is perhaps her most startling claim: that joint commitments create genuine obligations even in coercive circumstances, or when the goal the parties are jointly committed to espousing is an immoral one.  I return to this point below.  

Given an analysis of social groups as founded on joint commitments, the idea of membership in a particular social group can be understood in terms of being a party to the joint commitment that constitutes the group.  In virtue of the parties having jointly committed to pursue the goal in question, each also enjoys the standing to demand certain conduct from the others, or to rebuke them when the requisite acts are not undertaken.  Gilbert also appeals to the notion of a joint commitment to explicate other phenomena frequently associated with membership in a social group, such as the sense of betrayal when a group member fails to uphold the joint commitment.

In order for two or more people to enter into a joint commitment, each must express a readiness to be jointly committed with the other to doing X as a body, and the expression of readiness by each must be common knowledge to all.  Meeting the readiness condition requires that each agent be aware that by doing or not doing a certain act, certain normative consequences will follow (e.g. that she will owe certain conduct to the other with whom she has become jointly committed), though Gilbert emphasizes that an agent need not enter a joint commitment deliberately.  The necessary expression of readiness can take many forms, including not only a statement to the effect that one is prepared to jointly commit with others, but also actions undertaken against a background that makes them intelligible as expressions of readiness to be jointly committed.  In the latter case, one act may suffice, or the necessary expression of readiness may require a series of actions over time.

Societies are a particular kind of social group, distinguished from other types of social groups by the fact that the joint commitment that constitutes them is to a social rule.  Gilbert writes that “there is a social rule in population P if and only if the members of P are jointly committed to accepting as a body a requirement (or fiat) of the following form: members of P are to perform action A in circumstances C” (197).  Political societies are ones whose members are jointly committed to a particular kind of social rule, which Gilbert labels a governing rule.   Roughly, governing rules are those that “settle a matter that demands settling for the sake of the peaceful progress of life” (186).  Governing rules come in two types: personal, in which the members of a political society are jointly committed to doing what a particular person commands them to do, and rules of governance, or constitutional rules, where the commitment is to do what a person who meets certain conditions (e.g. being the daughter of the king) commands them to do.  For agents to be jointly committed to upholding the political institutions of their society, then, is simply for them to be jointly committed to the (possibly conditional) rule of some person or officeholder.

Given the conditions for the acquisition of a joint commitment, one might wonder whether citizens of a modern state can plausibly be described as being jointly committed to upholding that state’s political institutions.  After all, not only do most citizens of modern states have no personal relationship with one another, they are often unaware of the very existence of many of their compatriots as individuals (as opposed to mere numbers in a count of the population).  Gilbert refers to these properties as impersonality and anonymity, and argues that they do not bar the possibility of a joint commitment amongst a population characterized by them.  As long as (a) all those in the population share a conception of the population, such as ‘people living on the island’ or ‘Americans’; (b) all those in the population are ready to enter a particular joint commitment with all of the others in the population; (c) all of them have expressed a readiness to jointly commit with one another under the relevant description (i.e. as people living on the island, or as Americans); and (d) this readiness to jointly commit is common knowledge across the population, impersonality and anonymity do not bar the those in the population from jointly committing to espouse some goal as a body (174-81).  Of course, as Gilbert points out, whether a particular population meets these conditions is an empirical question.

As noted above, Gilbert claims that “neither coercive circumstances nor immoral content prevents a joint commitment from obligating the parties in the usual way” (289).  If correct, Gilbert’s claim has important implications for political obligation.  If the conditions set out in the previous paragraph are met, then subjects of a state have an obligation of joint commitment to uphold its institutions even though they did not freely or deliberately enter into the joint commitment to do so; moreover, they have reason to do so even if the state’s institutions are morally unacceptable.  Gilbert emphasizes that, all things considered, a person who was coerced into a joint commitment, or who is party to a joint commitment with immoral content, may have reason not to do what he has an obligation of joint commitment to do.  Nevertheless, the joint commitment does create a genuine obligation; it provides relatively conclusive sufficient reason to act in the ways that joint commitment requires, so that neither inclination nor self-interest provides a rational justification for not acting in these ways.

This claim strikes me as mistaken.  I suggest that while Gilbert’s analysis of a wide range of social phenomena in terms of joint commitments – including membership in a group, acting together, promising, and forming agreements – accounts for the intelligibility (or unintelligibility) of much human conduct, such commitments do not by themselves provide reason for action.  Using Gilbert’s terminology, my claim is that joint commitments create imputed obligations; like legal obligations, imputed obligations of joint commitment may provide sufficient reason for action, but they may not, and whether they do so depends on something more than the fact that the parties have entered into a joint commitment.

Consideration of two examples – one involving a coerced promise and the other a promise with immoral content – help to illustrate the difference between Gilbert’s description of obligations of joint commitment as essentially normative, and my own description of such obligations as essentially descriptive.  Gilbert describes a case in which Carol, surprised by Jack while robbing his house, extracts from him at gunpoint a promise not to call the police.  Gilbert acknowledges that Jack is not morally required to refrain from calling the police.  Moreover, she writes that Carol “would surely not be morally justified in demanding that Jack keep the promise or rebuking him for going to the police” (229).  Yet Gilbert claims that it is counter-intuitive to claim that “no obligation of any kind accrues to Jack through his promise” (229).  She offers in support of this intuition H. A. Pritchard’s belief that promises necessarily obligate, though many readers may not find this compelling.  More interesting is Gilbert’s claim that “Carol is in a position to rebuke Jack for calling the police, citing his promise…” (229).  That seems right; indeed, the point can be emphasized by contrasting Carol with Fran, whom we can imagine also robbed Jack, but who did not extract any promise from him not to call the police.  It would sound bizarre were Fran to rebuke Jack for calling the police, whereas it would not sound similarly bizarre were Carol to do so.  But while this demonstrates the role that joint commitments play in making human conduct intelligible, there is no need to go a further step and claim that in light of his promise, Jack has reason not to call the police.  I do not think that Jack acts irrationally if inclination or self-interest moves him to call the police, despite his promise to Carol.  Yet if we accept that even coerced joint commitments create genuine obligations, as Gilbert characterizes them, then it seems we must describe Jack’s calling the police as contrary to reason.

The same concern frames my response to Gilbert’s discussion of joint commitments with immoral content.  Suppose that Alice promises Belle that she will kill Cass.  Does Alice have an obligation to Belle, despite the immoral content of her promise?  Gilbert says yes; Alice has an obligation of joint commitment to Belle, though all things considered Alice ought not to do what she has an obligation of joint commitment to do.  Gilbert defends this conclusion on the grounds that it is necessary to explain why it is that Belle can demand compensation from Alice should she fail to keep her promise.  If this were offered only as an account of the intelligibility of Belle’s actions, then it would be unproblematic.  But because Gilbert thinks joint commitments create genuine obligations, her claim is stronger.  Gilbert writes that in “paying for the promise she [Belle] was paying for Alice’s future action” (232).  Belle now “owns” the action, and since it is not forthcoming, she is owed compensation by the person who denies her what belongs to her – namely, Alice.  But a person can only be owed compensation for what rightfully belongs to her, and on the assumption that Belle has no right to Cass’s death, she cannot be owed compensation for Alice’s failure to cause it.

Gilbert might reply that the preceding analysis begs the question against her theory of joint commitment, since it simply assumes that promises with immoral content cannot create genuine obligations.  Consider, therefore, a second concern with Gilbert’s analysis of immoral (or coerced) promises.  Even if we grant that such promises create genuine obligations, it seems that such reasons for action will always be overridden by moral reasons for action.  It strikes me as odd to speak of a genuine reason that is always overridden, which suggests that being non-coerced and consistent with morality are at least necessary conditions for the creation or acquisition of genuine obligations of joint commitment.