A Theory of Race

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Glasgow, Joshua, A Theory of Race, Routledge, 2009, 172pp, $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415990738.

Reviewed by Eddy M. Souffrant, UNC Charlotte


Imagine the three following scenarios as a slice in the navigation of race.

Scenario 1: Two colleagues who specialise in chemistry apply for vacant positions in a firm. They are both invited to interview and visit the firm. One is offered one of the positions and the other is told that they (the interviewers) did not realize that he was a "negro." Admittedly this sort of racial and racist discourse took place in an era of racial hubris when candid racist expressions were tolerated.

Scenario 2: Young adults classified as members of a demeaned minority group opt for an exodus from that race and explore various means of identity. They contemplate denying that they are members of that race if they can, engaging in interracial relations with the hope of offering a "better prospect" to their prospective children, or changing, in their view positively, the meaning of that category of membership. Those who take the last option migrate in a sense from negre to negro to colored, to black, to African-American, etc.

Scenario 3: Some members of a democratic society are designated and assigned a particular social space with limited access to the goods of the society and are deemed minimally useful to the society because they are inherently less valuable as a group than the other more significant group(s) of that society. The designated lesser members of the society are visibly identifiable. To respond, they embark on a program of self-identification and valuation that compels them to carve out a uniqueness that is presumably exclusive to the group.

The first of the scenarios is loosely based on an account of an incident in the life of the noted chemist Percy Julian whose contributions to chemical research are thought to pale in comparison to what he would have contributed had he the luxury of non-racist society. The other two attempt to bring to mind the challenges of self-identification posed by racial thinking and categorization. They are also reminders of the potentially restorative powers of racial talks.

One would expect a theory of race to offer an understanding of the scenarios. It would suggest in broad terms what race is and how to make sense of the social and political ramifications of the concept. The scenarios presume that race is real and a theory of race would question whether the actions that follow from that reality are justifiable. So a quick response to the difficulties raised by these scenarios is to notice that they rely on conditions that support racial categorization and on the reality of race. If race is not real, or if we somehow rid ourselves of the concept, we would also rid ourselves of the nefarious consequences of the racial discourse that are sourced by the concept. There would be no room to experience the scenarios presented above. Some of the contemporary versions of a theory of race indeed argue that race is not real, but they also try to contend with the lived ramifications of a concept deemed not real.

Joshua Glasgow's A Theory of Race considers that approach and elegantly proposes an alternative solution to the scenarios that accounts for both the denial that race is biologically real and the relevance of race as a social concept.

In seven chapters and an afterword, Glasgow undertakes his exploration of the concept of race and the contemporary literature it has spawned. He enlists the help of some of the prominent race theorists of our time ranging from Kwame Anthony Appiah to Naomi Zack, Linda Martín Alcoff, Jorge Gracia, Michele Moody-Adams, Lucius Outlaw, Anna Stubblefield, Ronald Sundstrom and Paul Taylor, to name but a few of the authors whose views are considered in the text. These authors of race theories help Glasgow explain the race debate and facilitate his goal to have us understand the concept of race and what it entails. From this foundational exposition, Glasgow proceeds to consider the various constituents of, and justifications for, racial discourse.

Racial discourse depends on the reality of race. That bond informs any viable theory of race. A sustainable racial discourse is gauged by that basic standard of reality. What if race is not real? What becomes then of racial discourse? Glasgow's innovative approach answers both the problems inherent in my scenarios as they are presented above and the apparent ontological challenge that racial discourse engenders. Glasgow argues that even if there is no biological basis for race and race is an illusion, it does not follow that racial discourse should be eliminated. Instead he proposes to "reconstruct racial discourse … to eliminate the biological pretensions of that discourse … [and also] to eliminate any racist pretensions." (136)

For Glasgow, discarding biological pretensions leaves room for a theory of race that attends to the social realities of the time. My three scenarios point to some of the social circumstances that could arise from assuming that race is real and then assigning natural places to groups and their members. We notice that in scenario 1, race is used to keep some from benefiting from the structures of a liberal and democratic society. In scenario 2, race, whether intentionally or not, overwhelms efforts to express individuality and promotes apathy and self-hatred. Scenario 3 suggests that race imposes on a marked group, however unclear the boundaries of the group, the obsession of group self-expression and racial identities. For these reasons alone, the concept seems important enough not to be uncritically discarded.

Glasgow argues that there are important ways in which race is not real. However, given an understanding of ordinary persons' practices, there are ways in which race is meaningful and real. Race is a "social kind." With this folk-supported observation, Glasgow restores at once the reality of race and the relevance of racial discourse. He meets head on the challenge of ontology posed earlier. Racial discourse, he claims, does speak about something real and pertains to the moral, social and political problems of which most of us are aware and which flow from the misuse of the concept of race. Glasgow believes that his reconstruction of race is "more likely to help us deal with our social ills and to preserve the identities that many find valuable." (153) His understanding of race is helpful. It resolves the problem of coherence between conceptions of race that rely on biology and those that rely on social practice. If race is not a biological kind, how should one explain social practices that are fueled by a concept of race? Glasgow's work argues that the social ramifications of race are real because race is real. For him, "races*[sic] are social kinds that we demarcate in terms of otherwise unimportant and continuous visible traits of the relevant sort, whose kind-hood in and of itself signifies nothing other than that we categorize people in that way." (150)

While I find most of Glasgow's exposé informative and elegant, I am troubled by this last quotation, which seems to concede either what I would call an embedded cognitive racialism, i.e. that we are cognitively 'wired' to categorize individuals as races or, if we reject cognitive racialism, that racial categorization is an inevitable component of our social arrangements. I am not convinced that either disjunct is true. For first it seems to me that race is not a constitutive component of our cognitive apparatus. Even if we agree that we are structured (endowed with a cognitive apparatus) so as to apprehend the world as we do individually and as human beings in general, the kind of world that we apprehend relies to a certain extent on our socialization.

Individuals, on my account, do not come into society as fully formed persons even if they are equally equipped to become fully formed. They first enter as members of a group. They deter­mine their identity as a result of their interaction with other members of the group. For our purposes, the extent to which one becomes racialized, or able to recognize races, depends in large part on the extent to which the group to which one belongs, or to which one is relegated, is racialized. Here I am using `racialization' to serve two goals: it helps me speak, on the one hand, of groups categorized on the basis of race and, on the other hand, of groups that would actively assign others to races.

If one's racial identity is truly based on a conception formed by one's membership in a group, the racialized group will yield, on the whole, racialized individuals. If it is the case that there are racializing and racialized groups that influence the perception and the social development of persons, racial attributions would seem to be learned, even if we admit an a priori cognitive apparatus. If racial discourse is learned, it is difficult to understand what Glasgow means by the claim that we categorize people by race. From what I have said, that is not a given.

The larger implication of rejecting that we are cognitively 'wired' to locate persons as members of races is that we could in principle be rid of racial discourse. I am inclined to reject this alternative as well. For support, I am helped by Kwasi Wiredu's discussion of the tools with which the African philosopher can rid herself of the colonial mind, a cognitive prejudice to reject the role that cultural conditions play in our apprehension and expressions of universals as well as particulars. Adapting Wiredu's analysis of the nature of universals and particulars to our concern here regarding race would suggest that racial categorizations as expressions of universals are not inevitable. They are instead products of particular circumstances and territories. To make the point that I understand Glasgow to make, namely that races as social kinds are universals and pervasive, will depend in large part on the analytical vigilance of the person whose task it is either to identify particular instantiations of the universals or to apply the universals to particular circumstances. In effect, we should be asking a totally different question. It would not be a question of whether race is the way we instinctively categorize people. It would instead be a quest for how race is instantiated within different cultures or territories.

I am not sure however that this is a task on which we wish to embark. I am not looking to establish that race is a universal concept found in varying instantiations the world over, modified only by cultural idiosyncrasies. Rather the point is to attempt to make sense of Glasgow's suggestion as I understand him that we (perhaps instinctively) categorize persons by race and that racial discourse is not only meaningful but inescapable. What I have said about the influence of group membership and culture on our understanding of the world that we share encourages me to think that race and racial discourse, even of the kind Glasgow speaks, are accidental. We can certainly envision, given this accident of human social history, a history devoid of race and racial discourse.

The issue I first addressed was whether admitting with Glasgow that race is a relevant concept, namely that it is real as a social kind, would entail a rejection or adoption of racial discourse. Glasgow has shown in his work, and I agree with him, that race is real but real as a social kind. The concept has impacted our social lives in numerous ways. Racial discourse, a conduit to recognizing the full impact of the concept, can help establish a program to restore a viable moral, social and political community. For these reasons among others, Glasgow rejects the calls for ridding ourselves of racial discourse. Thus for him, race is real and racial discourse is beneficial. While I think that students and practitioners of philosophy of race will benefit from Glasgow's work, I disagree with him that racial discourse is as inherently important as he seems to suggest. Understanding race as a social kind provides substance to racial discourse, but as social descriptions racial attributions are ephemeral and could be advantageously eliminated with minimal negative repercussions on our cognitive and social apparatuses. This point requires greater elaboration than I can offer here. So I would invite the reader to weigh in on the direction suggested by Glasgow's significant contribution to the field.